Impressions of Hume

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Marina Frasca-Spada and P. J. E. Kail (eds.), Impressions of Hume, Oxford University Press, 2005, 320pp, $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199256527.

Reviewed by Donald C. Ainslie, University of Toronto


The multiply ambiguous title aptly reflects the scope of this collection of essays. The largest group explores the impressions that were made on Hume by his upbringing, his local culture, and his philosophical formation. M. A. Stewart, in the longest essay of the collection, provides the most complete account of the early parts of Hume's life to be found in the literature, an especially welcome contribution given that Hume's masterwork, A Treatise of Human Nature,1 was a product of this period. Both the co-editor, Peter Kail, and Susan James examine the influence of Malebranche on Hume's philosophy, respectively his sceptical epistemology (about which more below) and his humanistic and anti-absolutist treatment of sympathy and the passions. James Harris shows that one of the quirks of Hume's writings on religion -- his tendency to preface his devastating attacks on arguments for the existence of God with a seemingly fideistic affirmation of the belief in God -- must be understood in the context of the political struggles between factions in the Scottish church of his day. Richard Sarjeantson examines the influence of early-modern treatments of logic on Hume's discussion of general rules and philosophical methodology. Susan Manning traces Hume's use of political language in his account of personal identity to the debates in Scotland over the significance of the 1707 Act of Union.

Another set of essays investigates the impressions that Hume has made on philosophy. Martin Bell explains Gilles Deleuze's interpretation of Hume. Peter Lipton explores why Hume was able to formulate the problem of induction that haunts us still, while prior sceptical philosophers passed it by. R. M. Sainsbury shows us how Hume's treatment of causation remains a challenge to contemporary metaphysics and philosophy of mind.

A third set of essays looks at the impressions that Hume made on his contemporaries. Emilio Mazza investigates the responses of two contributors to the Enlightenment in Italy -- the brothers Pietro and Allesandro Verri -- especially their reactions to Hume's and Rousseau's falling out. Sarah Pearsall focuses on the letters of an Anglo-American couple, reading their negotiation of marital discord through the lens of Hume's and other early-modern discussions of marriage and sexuality.

Finally, co-editor Marina Frasca-Spada looks at Hume's own account of impressions. She uses a popular eighteenth-century novel to motivate her discussion of the difference between the impression-like beliefs that Hume thinks we derive from reading history with the less vivacious -- though often more attention-demanding -- ideas that result from reading fiction.

It should be clear, then, that this a wide-ranging collection. What it lacks in thematic unity is made up for by its admirable breadth in method and style. Continental and analytic philosophy, literary criticism, intellectual history, philosophically-oriented history of philosophy, and biography all make an appearance here. The editors are to be commended for bringing together Hume scholarship from across the disciplines.

I will focus on one essay for more detailed, though still brief, comment -- namely Peter Kail's intriguing suggestion that the Conclusion to Book 1 of the Treatise is best read as Hume's rejection of Malebranche's ethical ideal, where we are to strive to overcome our corrupt natures by withdrawing from the senses and striving to follow the divine in us, reason. Rationalist, inward-looking philosophy is the means to achieving this ideal and thus, for Malebranche, all of us should pursue it. Kail sees Hume as recommending an alternative outward-looking, "public and human" (137) view of philosophy. It is to be pursued for the pleasure it gives and its usefulness in combating superstition, not because it makes us closer to God (136). While Kail is clearly right about the anti-Malebranchian tenor of Hume's overall philosophical project, I am less convinced that this is a dominant theme of the Conclusion.

The Conclusion is maddeningly complex, as Hume reviews for us his earlier arguments about reason and the senses only to call both them and his doubts about them into question. The climax is what amounts to a nervous breakdown as Hume cries out with anguish: "Where am I, or what?" His only escapes are backgammon, conversation, and dinner with friends, though he does eventually return to philosophy with a newly chastened attitude (T, SBN 269).

This section of text has been at the centre of recent debates in the secondary literature and, if Kail is right, he will have added a fourth item to the menu of interpretations currently available for it. The other options are, first, the traditional sceptical interpretation, in which Hume decides to ignore reason's negative verdicts on the deliverances of the senses and of reason.2 Second, the naturalist interpretation that originated with Norman Kemp Smith in which our natural incapacity to believe those verdicts is given a normative weight that trumps them.3 And third, the dialectical interpretation of Annette Baier, in which Hume's narrator's experience of the failings of a narrow intellectualist conception of the mind drives him to adopt a more adequate passion-involving account of reason and the senses.4

But Kail's argument for a new ethical interpretation remains somewhat underdeveloped, making it difficult to determine the extent to which it differs from the other interpretive options. Part of the problem is that he focuses primarily on the later parts of the Conclusion, where Hume returns to philosophy, rather than on the "desponding reflections" (T, SBN 264) that drive him to his breakdown. Once we have returned to philosophy, are we to accept the "trivial" propensities of the imagination that cause us to believe what our memories tell us of the past, what our senses tell us of the external world, or what our reason tells us to believe (T, SBN 265)? Kail sometimes sounds like Baier, as if the philosophical problematic that caused us to ask these questions has been abandoned with the adoption of the new pleasure-motivated philosophy. But why think that some of us will not continue to take pleasure in exactly this kind of abstruse philosophy? And what are we to make of Hume's repeated invocations of his arguments about reason and the senses when he moves on from the Conclusion to investigate the passions and morality (e.g., T, SBN 366)?

Kail also on occasion sounds like the sceptical interpreters: "One may see the conclusion as a Pyrrhonian moment of despair, a realization of the failure of reason" (127). Why then should we trust what we now know to be a failed reason when returning to philosophy for the fun of it? Or does Kail mean to offer a modified version of the naturalist strategy whereby reason's failure is trumped, not by our natural beliefs, but by whatever cognitive practices are agreeable or useful to their possessors or those around them -- by Humean cognitive virtues (128, 134-7)? But what virtues would those be? Wisdom involves properly assessing the evidence for your beliefs,5 and so if reason speaks against a belief, it should be rejected. Prudence requires getting the facts right, for false information will undermine your practical endeavours (T 2.3.3). If Kail takes Hume to endorse the negative claims in the first portion of the Conclusion, I do not see how the virtues will help us to overcome them.

My own interpretation of the Conclusion nonetheless shares much with Kail's. Like him, I think that one of its ultimate goals is to downgrade the place of philosophy. It is to be undertaken for the pleasure it gives and for it usefulness in combating superstition. But it is not for everyone.

[T]here are in England, in particular, many honest gentlemen, who being always employ'd in their domestic affairs, or amusing themselves in common recreations, have carried their thoughts very little beyond those objects, which are every day expos'd to their senses. And indeed, of such as these I pretend not to make philosophers, nor do I expect them either to be associates in these researches or auditors of these discoveries. They do well to keep themselves in their present situation; and instead of refining them into philosophers, I wish we cou'd communicate to our founders of systems, a share of this gross earthy mixture, as an ingredient, which they commonly stand much in need of, and which wou'd serve to temper those fiery particles, of which they are compos'd. (T, SBN 272).

Given that most philosophers have tended to fall into what Hume calls "false" philosophy, we would be better off if we did not feel attracted to this activity.

But I think Hume also wants to show that there are some questions -- about the ultimate reliability of our sensing and reasoning -- that philosophy turns out to be unable to answer. So not only must the motivations for philosophy change, so also must its topics. Hume says: "For my part, my only hope is, that I may contribute a little to the advancement of knowledge, by giving in some particulars a different turn to the speculations of philosophers, and pointing out to them more distinctly those subjects, where alone they can expect assurance and conviction" (T, SBN 273).

The essays in this collection show that Hume's hope was in part fulfilled. The speculations of philosophers have turned because of the impressions he made on them. Perhaps they have not reached assurance and conviction, but the essays collected here do show the many respects in which Hume continues to help advance knowledge.

1 A Treatise of Human Nature, L. A. Selby-Bigge (ed.); 2nd edition, P. H. Nidditch (ed.), (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1978), 273; A Treatise of Human Nature, David F. Norton and Mary J. Norton (eds.), (Oxford: Oxford UP, 2000). Hereafter I will refer to various subsections of the Treatise as 'T' followed by Book, Part, and Section numbers given in large Roman, small Roman, and Arabic numerals respectively. I will identify quotations with 'T' followed by the appropriate Selby-Bigge-Nidditch page number, and the Section and paragraph number as given in the Norton and Norton edition.

2 Recent defenders of the sceptical interpretation are Robert Fogelin, Hume's Skepticism in the Treatise of Human Nature (New York: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1985) and Wayne Waxman, Hume's Theory of Consciousness (Cambridge: Cambridge UP, 1994).

3 The Philosophy of David Hume (London: Macmillan, 1941). The best recent naturalist interpretations are Don Garrett's in Cognition and Commitment in Hume's Philosophy (New York: Oxford UP, 1997) and David Owen's in Hume's Reason (Oxford: Oxford UP, 1999).

4 A Progress of Sentiments (Cambridge: Harvard UP, 1991). See also W. E. Morris, "Hume's Conclusion," Philosophical Studies 99 (2000), 89-110.

5 Enquiries Concerning Human Understanding and Concerning the Principles of Morals, L. A. Selby-Bigge (ed.); 3rd edition, P. H. Nidditch (ed.), (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975), 110. Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding: A Critical Edition, Tom Beauchamp (ed.), (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2000), Section X, Part 1, ΒΆ4.