Improper Life: Technology and Biopolitics from Heidegger to Agamben

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Timothy C. Campbell, Improper Life: Technology and Biopolitics from Heidegger to Agamben, University of Minnesota Press, 2011, 189pp., $25.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780816674657.

Reviewed by Ladelle McWhorter, University of Richmond


Timothy Campbell's Improper Life is a thought-provoking examination of the closely related themes of biopolitics and technology in the work of Michel Foucault, Giorgio Agamben, Roberto Esposito, and Peter Sloterdijk. Campbell's central argument is that the conjunction of these two themes, in the wake of Heidegger's critique of modern technology (particularly as it unfolds in his 1942-43 lecture series Parmenides), results in a drift toward what Campbell calls "thanatopolitics" (vii) in these four later thinkers' work. Campbell's aim is to make explicit the ways in which their assumptions about technology push their biopolitical reflections toward pessimism and predictions of catastrophe and then to articulate some possibilities for alternative, positive, biopolitical reflection and practice, which he gathers under the names of "attention" and "play" (chapter 4).

Campbell begins with Heidegger's discussion of typewriting and handwriting in Parmenides. (This is essentially one paragraph spanning pages 80-81 in Schuwer and Rojcewicz's English translation.) Heidegger says here that mechanical means for inscribing and communicating are among "the main reasons for the increasing destruction of the word" (Heidegger 1992, 81). The realm of the hand is the proper realm of the word, from which the typewriter (and no doubt the computer) tear writing away. The typed word is a mere transcription of writing that serves to preserve it. The word thus becomes a mere means of communication. Obviously this analysis of the typewriter connects closely with Heidegger's analysis of modern technology in "The Question Concerning Technology," where he speaks of modernity's conversion of the soil into mineral deposits and the river into a resource for generation of electricity (Heidegger 1977, 14, 16). Modern technology reveals the world in the manner of challenging and reveals it as standing-reserve. Everything, even human beings, is transformed into a potential resource, made available, stored up, and deployed.

Heidegger's is by now a familiar analysis, as Campbell observes; hence, he does not explicate it in detail. Instead, he considers two points. One is that Heidegger's emphasis falls not on technology, but on modernity. Technology -- technē -- per se is not critiqued here (5). (In fact, although Campbell does not mention this, Heidegger makes clear that the peasant farmer's cultivation of the field is not a challenging and does not render the earth mere standing-reserve; see Heidegger 1977, 15). The other point that Campbell considers -- a key one for his entire analysis -- is Heidegger's characterization of the writing hand as "the properly acting hand" (Heidegger 1992, 81). This phrase introduces a distinction between the proper and the improper -- and in particular proper and improper writing -- that Campbell traces and questions throughout the work of Agamben, to some extent that of Esposito, and certainly that of Sloterdijk.

Like Heidegger, Agamben finds the flattening out or homogenization of human being in modern technologies deeply disturbing (36). Just as the typewritten word makes one person's (hand)writing indistinguishable from another's, technologies of all sorts obscure human differences and even eradicate them. Technology de-subjectifies, rendering people docile, inert, and forgetful of the essence of proper action (37, 56). De-subjectified, individuals become expendable; they can be sacrificed. They become, in Agamben's words, Homo sacer, bare life, zoē. This sacrilization of the masses invites -- to put it bluntly -- mass slaughter. Genocide, unchecked pandemic, spectacular scenes of regional deprivation and widespread hunger are familiar in our world, even more or less normal and unremarked. It is exceedingly rare for those responsible for such events to be held to account and punished. And, on Agamben's analysis, that fact makes perfect sense; the essence of Homo sacer is to be kill-able with impunity.

Agamben sees, then, a biopolitical world as a thanatopolitical world. When systems of power take life as their object -- and in particular when the production of bare life becomes their objective -- thanatopolitics is an inevitable outcome. There is no such thing as a positive biopolitics. This position is, of course, what Campbell wants to challenge and displace.

Campbell sees Agamben as making two important moves: (1) He expands the notion of dispositif or apparatus to the point that it encompasses virtually any type of technē, and (2) he holds that contemporary forms of governmentality multiply "dispositifs that allow for the movement of a host of beings and things from the sphere of the profane to the sphere of the sacred" (49). This is not an overstatement. Consider Agamben's own words in What is an Apparatus?:

I shall call an apparatus literally anything that has in some way the capacity to capture, orient, determine, intercept, model, control, or secure the gestures, behaviors, opinions, or discourses of living beings. Not only, therefore, prisons, madhouses, the panopticon, schools, confession, factories, disciplines, juridical measures, and so forth . . . but also the pen, writing, literature, philosophy, agriculture, cigarettes, navigation, computers, cellular telephones and -- why not -- language itself (Agamben 2009, 14).

Campbell is surely right to attribute much of Agamben's anxiety and his at times terrifying picture of the modern world to these generalizations -- generalizations not found in Foucault's work, as Campbell notes (49).

Campbell finds more resources for his project of developing a positive biopolitics in the work of Roberto Esposito. In his genealogy of the apparatus of the person, Esposito distinguishes the person and the subject, which enables him to posit a dimension of impersonality wherein he locates the potential for a positive biopolitics. The impersonal escapes the dichotomy of inclusion/exclusion that marks the person and that characterizes contemporary politics of property and ownership. The impersonal is neither property nor an owner of property; it lacks propriety altogether and thus seemingly eludes the Heideggerian distinction between proper and improper life. Campbell writes, "Person and its impolitical form that go under the name of the impersonal offer a much larger purview for philosophy to come to grips with what is most pressing today -- thinking life beyond merely zoē and bίos" (66). A positive biopolitics requires this (re)thinking of life; it would have to be predicated upon an understanding of life that is not already captured by thanatopolitical discourses such as Agamben's.

Campbell sees a problem with Esposito's impersonal approach, however. The impersonal may in some ways threaten individual rights -- a concern that echoes Heidegger's warnings about the They (79). If rights are compromised, we may find ourselves back in the realm of Homo sacer, unable to object effectively to widespread sacrifice. Campbell worries that "perhaps the thanatopolitical may have found a back door in Esposito's thinking not because of its continued inclusion in a dispositif of the person but because of the threat it poses for individual identity" (79). Still, Campbell finds Esposito's work much more promising than Agamben's and Sloterdijk's.

Sloterdijk mourns the loss of proper community, much as Esposito and Agamben do (101). He sees turns toward the thanatopolitical at four crucial historical points, which Campbell summarizes on page 116. These include the moment at which Western humanity was forced to look to the earth for meaning because transcendent meaning was denied it, the moment at which Western humanity encountered a seemingly hostile or dangerous "outside" to itself in the process of colonization, the moment at which the individuated household becomes an apparatus for immunization ("household" being characterized as "the improper entity within which those with similar immunization protocols will be housed" (97)), and the moment at which Marxism's pure rage allows the killing of the bourgeoisie. All of these are instances of radical separation and are generally accompanied by violence against whatever and whoever is designated as "outside." In the name of life, life is sacrificed.

Sloterdijk does see a possibility for a positive biopolitics, which will come with bioengineering or what Campbell calls "anthropotechnical techniques." Eventually, these techniques "will save humanity by creating superior human beings who can manage the human animal zoopolitically" (115). Campbell is profoundly skeptical of this tack, dismissing it, in effect, as naïve:

What Sloterdijk cannot see is that technology in the form of bioengineering is also a product of the market and that the majority of humanity that he sees as having been exposed with little or no immunity protection risks being extended dramatically to all but those few individuals who have been engineered to rise above the animalized masses (116).

Campbell suspects that in such a scenario it is more likely that the bioengineered superiors would distance themselves from the others and thus create, not a new kind of proper community, but simply another round of separation attended by sacrifice.

A positive biopolitics must move beyond these dichotomies of inside/outside, subject/object, and proper/improper. To do so, it must distinguish among varieties of technē. Drawing on Foucault (especially The Hermeneutics of the Subject), Campbell raises the possibility of thinking of "technē not linked primarily to a defense of the self and its borders but rather as an opening toward the relational" (119). Contra Agamben, for Foucault technē is not always a dispositif. It was not always (historically at least) aimed at capturing and molding the self, as Foucault shows in his studies of ancient Greece and Rome. Instead, technē could be what enabled the construction of multiple forms of life.

This distinction between the self and life is crucial for Campbell. A positive biopolitics will be one that takes up (or invents) technē for the shaping of bίos, not the bounded self (142). Two areas that Campbell suggests for development in this regard are attention and play. He understands attention through Merleau-Ponty as a stretching toward without taking hold. We can prolong the time of attention -- and thus cultivate it as a practice -- by taking some clues from Deleuze and Guattari's notion of haecceity. Haecceity is a kind of space that is not merely a backdrop but is, rather, a scene for compositional encounter, a space where things come together (such as dying rat and air), where relations are primary over identities. It is a space of becoming (145). Attention to and in such spaces can emphasize modes of being rather than just being. Attention would not jump to mark or fix attributes of being and thus would preclude distinctions between proper and improper that result in exclusion and, perhaps ultimately, sacrifice. Campbell brings our attention to Walter Benjamin here and to the notion of immanent critique that does not judge but rather explores relationships. Campbell also urges consideration of play as a kind of technē. This would not be the play of gaming, with its rules, victories, and defeats, but rather the playing with that characterizes children's interactions with toys. The toy, as Benjamin says, enables the child to transform him/herself into something else, to become the horse that pulls the wagon, for instance. Campbell asks, "Can we play at forms of life not captured by the self?" (154). Would it be possible to effect a kind of slackening of the self in favor of multiplying forms of life? "The move from the bordered self to the slackened subject of the practices of bίos minimizes the contact that borders inevitably share with thanatos" (155). While the self does not disappear, it may be moved toward greater openness and relationality and less defense. It may be transformed.

As I hope this summary demonstrates, Campbell's book is original and intriguing. He is critical of the philosophers whose work he examines, but he also finds resources in them for a project of constructing a positive biopolitics. By way of conclusion, I would like to raise three points of concern that should not be seen as detracting from the value of Campbell's work.

First is a minor quibble with Campbell's treatment of Agamben. Campbell's main focus is Agamben's Heideggerian suspicion of technology, not his appropriation of Foucault's term biopower. He notes that Agamben extends Heidegger's critique of modern technology to encompass all forms of technology throughout history regardless of context or specificities of effect. Spoken language falls under Agamben's extended critique just as squarely as does the cell phone. He writes that language is the most ancient of apparatuses, "one in which thousands and thousands of years ago a primate inadvertently let himself be captured, probably without realizing the consequences that he was about to face" (Agamben 2009, 14). Agamben's is a radically ahistorical view of subjectivity, power, and human being. Campbell gestures toward this aspect of Agamben's appropriation of Foucault when he notes that Agamben "unmistakeably elides biopower's inscription in the expansion of capitalism that occurred at the end of the eighteenth century" (37), but in my opinion he under-emphasizes it. Agamben completely detaches biopower from the genealogy of "life" that Foucault offers in The Order of Things and The History of Sexuality, Vol. 1. "Life" is an historically emergent concept, according to Foucault. There is no "life" and hence no apparatus of power that takes "life" as its target prior to the late eighteenth century. On Foucault's terms, a positive biopolitics would be a politics that takes up this historically emergent notion of life and affirms it. Campbell's lack of attention to this detail leads me to fear that his own conception of biopolitics may be deficient in the same way.

In a similar vein, I found throughout the book that there were points at which critique of the current political landscape as thanatopolitical seemed to slide into critical practices that were themselves thanatopolitical. In other words, it was not always clear to me whether Campbell meant to be saying that our biopolitical world is actually not as marked by thanatopolitics as thinkers like Agamben, Esposito, and Sloterdijk think it is, or whether he meant to be faulting them for the elements of thanatos in their own political stances. While of course critique is also always political intervention, so that the two cannot be radically separated, it does seem wrong to me to say, for example, that Foucault's analytics of power from the 1970s is thanatopolitical, while his ethical work in the 1980s presents us with a positive biopolitics (119, 127). I am not sure whether I would characterize Foucault's political interventions as specifically biopolitical or not. But I certainly do not believe that pointing out the death-dealing aspects of contemporary governmentality can be condemned as, somehow, "negative." I would be happier with the book if it had made these points clearer.

Finally, there are a few moments in the book where alertness to the ramifications of Foucault's understanding of power as relational seems to lapse. One that I found interesting but also telling comes in the discussion of Esposito. In elaborating on Esposito's genealogy of "person," Campbell characterizes neoliberalism as a regime in which "an individual harvests his own biopower . . ." (74). There is obviously a sense in which this metaphor is apt, and it is striking in its evocation of the notions of human resource and human capital. But it also suggests that power is thing-like, a notion that Foucault went to great lengths to dispel in his own analyses. One cannot harvest something that exists only in its exercise and only as relation.

For all his praise of Foucault, Campbell's work in the end strikes me as not Foucauldian enough. Still, this is a very provocative and interesting book. It does what a book should do: it inspires thinking in directions not thought before. I recommend it to anyone interested in biopower, biopolitics, and contemporary political thought.

Works Cited

Agamben, Giorgio, 2009. What is an Apparatus and Other Essays. Trans. David Kishik and Stefan Pedatella. Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press.

Heidegger, Martin, 1977. The Question Concerning Technology and Other Essays. Trans. William Lovitt. New York: Harper Torchbooks.

Heidegger, Martin, 1992. Parmenides. Trans. André Schuwer and Richard Rojcewicz. Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.