Improvising Improvisation: From Out of Philosophy, Music, Dance, and Literature

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Gary Peters, Improvising Improvisation: From Out of Philosophy, Music, Dance, and Literature, University of Chicago Press, 2017, 288 pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 13: 9780226452623.

Reviewed by John M Carvalho, Villanova University


Gary Peters introduces his book by stating emphatically, "I am not a philosopher" and, "to be absolutely clear," this book "is not a philosophical text" (1). At the same time, the book jacket identifies him as chair of philosophy and performance at York St. John University and as the author of two ostensibly philosophical books, Irony and Singularity and The Philosophy of Improvisation.[1] He seems to regard a philosophical text as one which clarifies, interprets or critiques what other philosophers have said (1), which is effectively what he appears to do in the entry "In the Moment: Improvisation and Time Consciousness" for the Oxford Handbook of Critical Improvisational Studies. For a general section titled "Philosophies" in that Handbook, where we find contributions by Philip Alperson, Lydia Goehr, Garry Hagberg, David Rothenberg and Arnold I. Davidson, all well-known philosophers, Peters offers an account of improvisation supported by an extended exegetical treatment of Edmund Husserl's Phenomenology of Internal Time Consciousness and exhibits a level of comfort there working with the writings of Hegel, Kierkegaard and Adorno. [2] In the book we are reviewing here, Peters draws for his improvisations on improvisation from a bevy of philosophers -- Kant, Hegel, Heidegger, Derrida and, most evidently, Deleuze -- and goes so far as to "bemoan the fact that Deleuze rarely speaks of improvisation" (140), leaving readers to infer that he believes more clarity from this philosopher would aid his decidedly not philosophical cause. Finally, he ends his book by aligning himself with Nietzsche reflecting on his own contributions to philosophy in Ecce Homo (245). "Behold the man." How are we to behold Gary Peters and the book he has written?

We can start by taking Peters at his word. He is not a philosopher, but he is, so he says, an improviser. If the aim of his book is to improvise on improvisation, and his is not a philosophical text, we cannot expect Peters to tell us what improvisation is. Rather, we are left to glean a sense of what he is up to from what he calls "Memoirs" and "Case Studies" where improvisation is exemplified in the work of performers that Peters admires: Lol Coxhill, most of all; but also Roger Turner and Mike Cooper who, with Coxhill, form The Recedents; Stinky Wrinkles (a jazz-funk band he formed with Veryan Weston); Bernard "Pretty" Purdie of the Del McCoury band; Jurij Konjar, Jimi Hendrix, Derek Bailey, Miles Davis and Cyndi Lauper. What he admires in these performers, and what he tries to achieve in his book, is the attempt "to create -- out of nothing -- a situation that, only then, can be entered into" (viii). What this creation entails, he says, is not the speed, "snap decisions, lightning choices, and quick-fire responses to the moment" commonly associated with improvisation. It is, rather, "painful, agonizingly slow, forever faltering, more error than trial, struggling to even begin, the interminable rehearsal of a decisive but barely graspable origin" (viii). It is not surprising, then, that the philosopher exclusively cited in Peters' "Preface" is Heidegger, and the influence of Heidegger pervades this book to the point that it is claimed, controversially and without argument that Deleuze is closer to Heidegger than is often acknowledged (142).

On this view, improvisation is about beginnings or, more properly, about preparing to begin since "there is no beginning . . . only the movement along a horizon that cannot be seen simply in terms of becoming but, rather, must be seen as the ever-transient point or moment of intersection which 'repeats and differentiates'" those beginnings (55).[3] To this end, there is an emphasis on rehearsal over practice (the first is inherently historical, the second inherently futural) but also on habit, about which we will have something to say below. There is also an emphasis on the decision and precision which precedes the "severe" choices the improviser contributes to the improvisation. It is important to remark, here, that the standard of improvisation for Peters (the concluding encomium to Cyndi Lauper notwithstanding) is what is ordinarily called "free improvisation" of the sort found in the performances of Coxhill and Bailey. He devotes a chapter to a taxonomy of different improvised practices -- fixed idiomatic, semi-fixed idiomatic, unfixed idiomatic, unfixed cross-idiomatic, fixed non-idiomatic, unfixed non-idiomatic -- to identify the goal of improvisation in general as unfixed, non-idiomatic or "free improvisation" (76). He does not make an argument in support of this claim, but proceeds as if it is supported by the account of difference and repetition in Deleuze's early, decidedly philosophical work.

He interprets Deleuze, provisionally, as making idiomatic improvisation a repetition of the same and non-idiomatic or free improvisation a repetition of difference. Idiomatic improvisation repeats the same idiom -- ballad, blues, bossa, bop, swing, etc. -- while non-idiomatic improvisation eschews the same to achieve difference (even as it threatens to become idiomatic in its refusal to be the same). Peters worries, though, that even the "pure difference" of non-idiomatic improvisation might amount to a repetition of the same. Deleuze, he says, suggests that, in contrast to the successive repetition of the same as difference, the differences in pure difference are "coexistent" (76). The worry appears to be that, while repetition makes difference at the first level by making the same turn up again as different from itself (because at another time, in another place, etc.), the repetition of differences as coexisting appears to make difference the same (by making differences turn up in the same time and place). Peters appears to have in mind (though he does not cite it) a passage in Difference and Repetition where Deleuze distinguishes a material repetition, based in habit and the succession of B following A (where A and B are different in degree but not in kind), and a spiritual repetition, based in memory and the coexistence of the past in the present.[4] These are the first two syntheses of time introduced by Deleuze in the chapter "Repetition for Itself," leading to a third synthesis in which "Time itself unfolds . . . instead of things unfolding in it." This synthesis is based on Nietzsche's eternal return, a model of the non-chronological time figured in the ancient Greek god Aion.[5]

In the first synthesis, habit, we have "a repetition of successive independent elements."[6] In the second synthesis, memory, we have "a repetition of the Whole on diverse coexisting levels."[7] In the third synthesis, time is "out of joint . . . demented time or time outside the curve which gave it a god, liberated from its overly simple circular figure, freed from the event which made up its content, its relation to movement overturned; in short, time presenting itself as an empty and pure form."[8] In the eternal return, difference is not successive or coexisting on however many diverse levels. In this synthesis of time, difference is repeatedly affirmed as difference. Chances are joyfully taken. This affirmation of difference and repetition seems to better suit Peters' preference for Nietzsche's amor fati in his account of improvisation, for the double affirmation of chance: once in the throw of the dice and, again, in accepting the result of that throw.[9] In Deleuzean parlance adapted to Peters' practice of improvisation, the third synthesis of time affirms the virtual sonic multiplicity which performers decisively commit to and draw from for the actual sounds they choose to play, which sounds, once played, devolve back into the virtual stock of that multiplicity.

On this model, intensities are formed on the surface of this sonic multiplicity. There is no depth, and there are no heights. Nomadic thought or improvisation is formed from intensities generated on that surface and by movements plotted along that same surface connecting and breaking intensities as they go. Peters suggests that he is sympathetic with such a view in the attention he gives to the rare instance where Deleuze, writing with Félix Guattari, refers to improvisation. In the passage, which Peters cites and unpacks in some detail (108-112 and 140-145), Deleuze and Guattari write, "but to improvise is to join the World, or to meld with it."[10] It is not clear, however, that Deleuze and Guattari are primarily concerned with improvisation in this passage. Peters fastens on the word "meld," se confondre in the original French (142). He wants to associate the meaning of the English word with the initiating of a card game, because it connects with his idea that improvisation is always about beginning, "the affirmation of chance that inaugurates the game" (142). Deleuze and Guattari seem to have something different in mind. Improvisation is presented, here, as one of three aspects of what they call the Refrain. A child, gripped with fear, sings to herself to keep the frightening chaos of the world at bay. Once at home with herself, she draws a circle around the fragile center generated by her song to organize a limited space. Having defined this territory, she opens the circle a crack and ventures out or lets someone in, not in the direction of the forces of chaos that led her to draw the circle, "but in another region, one created by the circle itself."

Deleuze and Guattari are describing a general process they call "territorialization" and "deterritorialization:" drawing lines that define a space in response to particular provocations that generate unanticipated openings onto a future always again fraught with provocations against which new lines will be drawn, new spaces defined. The Refrain is just one instance of this movement. Every plateau in A Thousand Plateaus is another. Further, improvisation is just one aspect of the Refrain intimately connected to the other two: making a mark on a dangerously unmarked surface and drawing boundaries around that mark to define the territory. If Peters is flummoxed by the rarity of Deleuze's comments on improvisation, perhaps he does not notice that Deleuze, and Deleuze and Guattari, are improvising, territorializing and deterritorializing, everywhere. Philosophy, as Deleuze practices it, is non-stop improvisation. He does not write books about philosophers and artists to clarify, interpret or critique them, but to play with them, to make something of them they have not made of themselves, to open them onto "cosmic forces" they cannot have anticipated. His collaborations with Guattari and Claire Parnet are entertained as ways to open himself onto a future defined, though otherwise unanticipated for him, by these very encounters.

Deleuze's improvisations are not limited, moreover, to his playing with other philosophical and artistic figures. As just noted, all of A Thousand Plateaus is an improvisation on territories, on the, as Peters notices, give and take between smooth and striated spaces. It is, at the same time, a figure of improvisation in general, articulated by the emergence of abstract machines from out of a plane of immanence which become concrete and devolve back into the plane, priming the surface for the emergence of ever more machines. Equally relevant for Peters, moreover, would be the relation between sense and nonsense in The Logic of Sense where events do not occur but are actualized or achieved, willed or affirmed.[11] First, thought gets its direction, its sense, from its encounters with nonsense. Then, the event is not something that happens but something affirmed, a chance, a fate (again, amor fati), and our only obligation is to become worthy of the event. There, too, relevant for Peters' concerns, this time critical of Peters' view, Deleuze contrasts irony with humor:

For if irony is the co-extensiveness of being with the individual, or of the I with representation, humor is the co-extensiveness of sense with nonsense. Humor is the art of the surface and of the doubles, of nomad singularities and of the always displaced aleatory point; it is the art of the static genesis, the savoir-faire of the pure event, and the "fourth person singular" -- with every signification, denotation, and manifestation suspended, all height and depth suspended. [12]

Improvisation, for Deleuze, achieves or enacts the event that associates a sense (as Frege coined the term) with the sort of nonsense he finds in Lewis Carroll (the patent nonsense Wittgenstein contrasts with ordinary nonsense) for decidedly comic effects.[13] Deleuze would likely find Peters' emphasis on irony to be too severe.

In the end, Peters does not require the imprimatur of Deleuze, or Deleuze and Guattari, or any philosopher, for the account of improvisation he wants to give. One wonders why, especially after the opening manifesto -- I am not a philosopher -- he bothers to cite them at all. His time might have been better served by making an argument for the privileged position he gives to free or unfixed non-idiomatic improvisation. He does not spend a lot of time denigrating more fixed and idiomatic forms;[14] he simply mentions them as having obviously fallen short of the mark of excellence set by unfixed non-idiomatic forms. He also does not give any attention to alternative views of improvisation. His collaborators in the Oxford Handbook mentioned above have made what many take to be important contributions to the subject, and there are others who might have been considered.[15] Perhaps that would make his book too philosophical. Perhaps it will not be too philosophical to point out that philosophers who know Deleuze will be tested by the use Peters makes of his writings. Readers with interests in improvisation will be struck by the severity of Peters' account, and the presentation of that account, as well as by the lack of attention given to the sheer pleasure of improvising. No doubt, there are still those who think that improvisation is all play and no work, to reverse the familiar saw, but they are surely fewer than those who practice and rehearse, who habituate themselves to habit, who know their history, who are decisive in their preparation to have a choice in what and how to play, to affirm chance, to love their fate, and who take pleasure in it.

[1] Gary Peters, Irony and Singularity: Aesthetic Education from Kant to Levinas (Routledge, 2005) and The Philosophy of Improvisation (University of Chicago Press, 2009).

[2] Gary Peters, "Improvisation and Time Consciousness," Oxford Handbook of Critical Improvisational Studies, vol. 1, ed. George E. Lewis and Benjamin Piekut (Oxford University Press, 2015), 439-457.

[3] Peters attributes this sense of no beginning, of an ever-transient point along a moving horizon, to Deleuze, but in this passage from the "Preface" to Difference and Repetition Deleuze is ventriloquizing an empiricist who could say "concepts are indeed things, but things in their free and wild state, beyond 'anthropological predicates'" (Difference and Repetition, trans. Paul Patton (Columbia University Press, 1994), xxi-xxii). What repeats and differentiates in the passage quoted from Peters refers to the "decentered centers" and "displaced periphery" of the concepts made, remade and unmade by such an empiricist. Peters fastens, here, on the repetition of the preposition "from" in the passage attributed to Deleuze. It's not clear what the significance of this can be. In the French, the preposition "de" is repeated three times: "Je fais, refais et défais mes concepts à partir d'un horizon mouvant, d'un centre toujours décentré, d'un périphérie toujours déplacée qui les répète et les différencie" (Difference et repetition (Presse Universitaires de France, 1968), 3.

[4] Deleuze, Difference and Repetition, 84.

[5] Deleuze, Difference and Repetition, 88.

[6] Deleuze, Difference and Repetition, 84.

[7] Deleuze, Difference and Repetition, 84.

[8] Deleuze, Difference and Repetition, 88.

[9] See Gilles Deleuze, Nietzsche and Philosophy, trans. Hugh Tomlinson (New York: Columbia University Press, 1983), 25-27.

[10] Gilles Deleuze and Félix Guattari, A Thousand Plateaus: Capitalism and Schizophrenia, trans. Brian Massumi (University of Minnesota Press, 1987), 311.

[11] Gilles Deleuze, The Logic of Sense, trans. Mark Lester (Columbia University Press, 1990), 149.

[12] Deleuze, Logic of Sense, 141.

[13] Ludwig Wittgenstein, Philosophical Investigations, trans. G. E. M. Anscombe (The Macmillan Company, 1968) ¶ 464.

[14] He ends, in fact, by celebrating Cyndi Lauper's improvisations on Time After Time which she performs just as it is written in the situation she actualizes as an event by performing it. "Cyndi Lauper improvises to the extent that she allows herself to be subject to (molded by) the improvisation of being that endlessly churns beneath the chance fixity of the song" (240). He might have compared Lauper's improvisation on the song to what he describes earlier in the book as Pierre Menard's improvisations on the Quixote from the perspective of a twentieth-century Frenchman (87-95).

[15] The list of those whose published insights on improvisation might have contributed to Peters' developed view is quite long. My own "Repetition and Self-Realization in Jazz Improvisation," Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 68.3 (Summer 2010), draws on Deleuze, and the three syntheses of time in Difference and Repetition, to address one problem in improvisation.