In Contradiction: A Study of the Transconsistent

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Graham Priest, In Contradiction: A Study of the Transconsistent, Oxford University Press, 2nd edition (expanded), 2006, 352pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 0199263302.

Reviewed by José Martínez Fernández, University of Barcelona


A dialetheia is a true contradiction, that is, a sentence A such that A ¬ A is true.  Since falsity is defined as truth of the negation, a dialetheia can be equivalently defined as a sentence A that is both true and false. The first edition of In Contradiction, published in 1987, has become the classical presentation and defense of dialetheism: the view that there are dialetheias. This thesis may look at first sight almost unintelligible, making us wonder what the meaning of truth and negation would be if there are true contradictions. But after reading the careful arguments that Priest builds to defend dialetheism, and the passionate attack he launches on classical logic and consistent views of the world, one realizes that dialetheism is a major logical theory, deserving a detailed examination.

The second edition of the book incorporates unchanged (apart from corrections of typographical errors and notational changes) the text of the first edition with its three parts and then adds a fourth part with six new chapters (ch.15-20), which comment on the text of the first edition and further develop some of its contents, expanding the book by one third[1]. I will begin by outlining the main changes and additions that Priest has made to the first edition of the book. I will then make two critical comments.


In Part I Priest argues for the existence of dialetheias. He proposes that the paradoxes that beset semantical theories (the liar paradox, Curry's paradox, the Berry paradox), set theory (Russell's paradox) and naive proof theory (Gödel's theorem) are all dialetheias, appealing to the initial plausibility of the arguments that engender the paradoxes and the failure of all attempts at their solution in consistent theories. Few things have been altered in this part.

The main changes affect Part II, which is devoted to the development of a dialetheic logic and truth theory. The logic LP is the solution Priest proposes to the problem of how to reason in the presence of dialetheias. There are two truth values, true and false, and sentences are related to one or both of them, according to Kleene's connectives, where Kleene's third truth value corresponds to sentences that are both true and false. Logical consequence is defined as preservation of truth. This logic is paraconsistent but has some undesirable consequences: modus ponens is an invalid form of argument. This is solved with the addition of an intensional conditional that satisfies modus ponens (but invalidates the principle of contraction in order to prevent Curry's paradox). In the second edition, the semantics of this operator is given in a possible-worlds semantics that distinguishes between possible and impossible worlds, using impossible worlds (where the laws of logic do not hold) to offer a countermodel to contraction.

One of the technically relevant changes of the book affects "classical recapture": we must be able to prove that it is correct to reason classically when reasoning in a consistent situation. The way this was done in the first edition has now been completely superseded by a simple and natural new logic, the non-monotonic logic LPm. Priest's newly added chapter 16 presents this logic. The basic idea is to measure the degree of inconsistency of each model (in the logic LP) by the set of atomic sentences that are dialetheias (i.e., that are true and false in the model, supposing that every element of the domain of interpretation has a name). Semantic consequence is then defined as preservation of truth in the models of the premises that are minimally inconsistent.

Part III of the book (chapters 9-13) applies the dialetheic theory of Part II to the analysis of several philosophical problems. In chapter 9, the paraconsistent logical theory is used to construct a theory that contains its own truth and satisfaction predicates.

Chapter 10 investigates the prospects of using a dialetheic logic to give a formalization of naïve set theory. In the first edition, Priest defended a nominalist view of mathematical language. To support that view, he produced a semantics of arithmetic and set theory that used only substitutional quantification, eliminating ontological commitment to numbers and sets. He no longer endorses nominalism, and now accepts a domain-and-satisfaction interpretation of mathematical language. He construes mathematical objects as a kind of nonexistent objects.[2] His new chapters 17, on inconsistent arithmetic, and 18, on paraconsistent set theory, give an overview of the development of dialetheic versions of these mathematical theories, presenting formal results and open problems.

In chapters 11 and 12, Priest analyses the metaphysics of change and proposes a dialetheic theory of change, according to which a state of change is a state in which a body has inconsistent properties. His new chapter 15 develops this account of change by applying it to the very notion of time, trying to explain the flow of time, its direction and the experience of the duration of the present as an effect of the dialetheic character of time.

Chapter 13 deals with inconsistent obligations that appear naturally in legal systems and can be formalized using a deontic expansion of the logic LP. An equivalent definition of this deontic logic is given here using possible-worlds semantics with impossible worlds.

The last two chapters of the book have a general character. Chapter 19 is an interesting autocommentary on the first edition of the book, in which Priest briefly signals how his views about the topics treated in the book have changed since the first edition. Finally, chapter 20 replies to recent versions of some of the most important criticisms of dialetheism.


I would like to comment on the relations between truth and negation, specifically between untruth and falsity. For a classical logician, these two concepts are equivalent. From a dialetheic perspective, one should consider two components separately: the principle of exhaustion[3] ¬ T<A> T<¬ A> (whatever is untrue is also false) and the principle of exclusion T<¬ A> ¬ T<A> (anything false is untrue). Priest endorses the first and tentatively rejects the second.

One of the reasons given to accept exhaustion is based on Dummett's analogy between games and assertion. In a one-player game, anything less than success is failure; therefore, since truth is the aim of the game of assertion, anything less than truth is falsity. In the autocommentary to the first edition (section 19.6), Priest accepts Parson's critique of the argument: namely, that it only establishes that anything less than true is untrue, but not yet that it is false (that is, that the negation is true). However, Priest thinks that the analogy shows that

as far as the linguistic act of assertion goes, there is nothing to distinguish between different ways in which an utterance may fail to meet its end -- and so for the distinction between A being false and A being neither true nor false to get a grip on. (p. 267)

But, even if the game analogy is correct, we can still distinguish between A being false and its being neither true nor false. Suppose that A is untrue, and consider the assertion of ¬ A. If the act of assertion of ¬ A succeeds, ¬ A will be true, and hence A will be false; otherwise ¬ A will be untrue, i.e., A will not be false, and then will be neither true nor false. The analogy is of no help in supporing exhaustion.

A second reason to accept exhaustion appeals to the correspondence theory of truth: if there is no fact that makes A true, then the fact that there is no such fact is a fact that makes ¬ A true. A defender of truth-value gaps could resist this conclusion by appealing to the notion of negation presupposed; for instance, a supervaluationist could say that the truth conditions of the sentence 'Ann is not tall' are such that, even though there is no fact that makes 'Ann is tall' true, that negative fact cannot make 'Ann is not tall' true, if Ann's height is borderline. Arguments in favour of a concept of negation that supports the exhaustion principle are presented in Priest's Doubt Truth to Be a Liar, chapter 4.

With respect to the principle of exclusion, Priest notices that there is a simple argument to prove it valid, if the conditional in the T-schema is contraposable. Applying the T-schema to ¬ A we get T<¬ A> ↔ ¬ A.  Contraposing the T-schema for A we get ¬ T<A> ↔ ¬ A. By transitivity, ¬ T<A> ↔ T<¬ A>. The exclusion principle trivially follows. Since Priest endorses the T-schema and rejects the exclusion principle, he has to reject the rule of contraposition of the conditional.[4] But if the conditional used in the T-schema is not contraposable, it will not satisfy modus tollens, which is as basic a form of argument as modus ponens is: it is the one that prompts us to revise our beliefs when confronted with contrary evidence. Of course, one could argue that the conditional used in the T-schema is not contraposable, even though in ordinary language there are contraposable conditionals. But this does not seem plausible: prima facie, the conditionals used in the T-schema and in the exhaustion and exclusion principles are the same, but clearly the principles validate contraposition: if the principle of exhaustion is true, it follows that if A is not false, then A is true. Since Priest accepts this argument, he should give some specific reasons to doubt the validity of contraposition in the case of the T-schema.

Are there any reasons that justify the rejection of the exclusion principle? If we accept the exclusion principle, it transforms any dialetheia T<A> T<¬ A> into an "external" contradiction: T<A> ¬ T<A>. This implies that if A is a dialetheia, then T<A> will also be a dialetheia. However, for many dialetheias A, T<A> should be simply true, not true and false. One of them is the sentence 'there are dialetheias', which expresses the central claim of dialetheism and which is a dialetheia, if the exclusion principle and the law of excluded middle are valid (p. 293). Since the exclusion principle produces unwanted inconsistencies, it is rejected using the methodological principle that says that 'contradictions should not be multiplied beyond necessity' (pp. 116, 71). The rationale that justifies this maxim is that the statistical frequency of dialetheias in normal discourse is low, so the probability that a contradiction is a dialetheia is also low, and it is rational to reject a contradiction, in the absence of reasons to the contrary.  But we should observe that, according to this rationale, the maxim is of no application here, since the exclusion rule produces contradictions in a semantical context, where dialetheias (according to Priest) can be expected to appear. If we apply the maxim, we would be rejecting what seems to be a plausible principle (that derives from the T-schema, given the properties of the conditional), just to prevent some contradictions. This looks as ad hoc as rejecting the exhaustion principle and introducing truth-value gaps just to prevent the liar paradox.

Priest remarks that a dialetheist can accept the exclusion principle (p.70), since the dialetheic semantical theory need not be consistent. The situation gets more complex when pragmatic considerations come into play. Acceptance and rejection are cognitive states: to accept something is to believe it, and to reject it is to refuse to believe it. Since one cannot believe something while at the same time refusing to believe it, acceptance and rejection are exclusive, although not exhaustive (agnosticism is always an available option, when one lacks enough information). Assertion and denial are speech acts that are the linguistic expression of acceptance and rejection. It is a natural principle that one should assert only what is true, and deny only what is untrue.[5] In the first edition, Priest defends the claim that no one can be rationally obliged to accept and reject the same sentence. Priest no longer supports that view, accepting the existence of rational dilemmas that oblige one both to accept and to reject the same sentence: the strengthened liar ('this sentence is not true') is one such, since we have good arguments for its truth and for its untruth. A rational dilemma imposes commitments that cannot be satisfied, and leaves us without knowing what to do.

If the exclusion principle is accepted, then any dialetheia would produce a rational dilemma and we would be obliged both to accept and to reject it. In particular we should reject the sentence 'there are dialetheias', and dialetheism would be self-defeating, rationally compelling us to reject its central claim. Furthermore, as Shapiro points out, any dialetheia would also be a non-dialetheia, posing the problem of how to express the notion of not being a dialetheia (p.293). Maybe these problems can be overcome, but I believe they pose a challenge to any dialetheist who would accept the exclusion principle.


In order to solve the paradox of the arrow (if a body does not move at each instant, it cannot move in an infinite set of instants) the dialetheic account of motion accepts the Spread Hypothesis: 'A body cannot be localised to a point it is occupying at an instant of time, but only to those points it occupies in a small neighbourhood of that time' (p.177). The hypothesis is made precise by saying that a body is moving at time t if, and only if, there is an interval of times θt (one of whose endpoints is t) such that, at the instant t, the body is simultaneously at all points where it is while in θt.

In section 20.5, Priest considers Tooley's objection that the account 'does not explain what it is for an object to have a certain velocity' (p.296) and replies that velocity can be defined just as it is defined in ordinary kinematic theory, as the derivative of the equation of movement with respect to time. But this reply has some interesting consequences, since the equation of the movement is not clearly defined in a dialetheic account of motion. If we suppose that, when a body is at point t, it is also at all points in θt, then the trajectory of its movement can be described by infinitely many functions obtained by (continuously) choosing a point from θt for each t. Let us give an example: consider a moving body, idealized as a point that moves along a real line according to the equation x = f(t) = t (the following discussion could be carried out for any equation of movement). Then its velocity is v(t) = 1. Suppose that the interval θt is [t - k, t], for some constant k > 0. Now consider the function g(t) = f(t - k/2(1 + sin t)) = t - k/2(1 + sin t). For every t, t - k/2(1 + sin t) θt, so g assigns to every time a position where the body actually is at that time. Hence g is as good a description of the movement of the body as f is.[6] But the velocity of the body, as given by g, is 1 - k/2 cos t, which is a non-constant function. So at most points the velocity of the body is inconsistent[7]: it is both 1 and different from 1. The acceleration, which was supposed to be 0, since the body was moving uniformly, happens also to be different from 0, since the second derivative of g is k/2 sin t. We have the result that any body that moves uniformly also moves with a non-zero acceleration. In order to account for inconsistent accelerations, we would have to consider inconsistent forces: since the body is moving uniformly, according to the principle of inertia the net force acting on the body is 0, but since it is moving with a positive acceleration, the net force is not 0. Where will this spreading of inconsistencies end and what will physics look like afterwards?[8] I suspect that the spread hypothesis will spread too many contradictions throughout physics.

In Contradiction covers an impressive range of subjects and my comments have only touched upon a minimal part of its contents. I strongly recommend its reading to anyone interested in logic and language.[9]


[1] Chapters 15-18 are revised version of previous papers by Priest and chapters 19-20 are new.

[2] This account is briefly presented in section 19.12, where the reader is directed to the full development of this view in Priest, Towards Non Being: The Logic and Metaphysics of Intentionality (Oxford U.P., 2005).

[3] We use <A> as a standard name of the sentence A. The quantifier 'for all sentences A' will be presupposed.

[4] In section 4.9, where this argument is presented, Priest defers reasons against contraposition to section 5.4. But there the only reason he gives to reject contraposition is that it implies the exclusion principle, and this in turn implies that if A is a dialetheia, then T<A> will be a dialetheia too, and there is no reason to suppose that that is the case. Hence, Priest has not produced any specific argument against contraposition independent from his reasons to reject the exclusion principle.

[5] Priest defends this principle in his Doubt Truth to Be a Liar (Oxford, 2006), chapter 6.

[6] One could argue that general methodological considerations of simplicity favor the choice of f as a description of the movement of the body over g. To see that these considerations are irrelevant for this problem, consider, per impossibile, a body that is at every time t at the places t and t - 1 (and only at those places). Why then should the equation of the body be f(t) = t instead of h(t) = t - 1? Since the body is in two places at the same time, it has both trajectories, and both equations are necessary to determine fully where the body is at each instant. The same considerations apply if the body is at every time t at the places f(t) and g(t) (and only at those places). Simplicity of f over g is irrelevant to the fact that physical laws that would explain only one of the equations would be inadequate to describe the world. Adding more inconsistencies will only add more admissible equations for the description of the movement.

[7] Actually the situation is even worse: at all points velocity is also undefined, since we can consider the following description of the movement: h(t) = t, if t < t0; h(t) = t0, if t0 t t0 + k; h(t) = t - k, if t > t0 + k, which has no first derivative at t0.

[8] The book does not say how the dialetheic theory of motion should be implemented in quantum mechanics. Anyway a solution in a Newtonian framework must be feasible. If the value of k is on the order of Planck's constant (as Priest suggests on p. 179), how could these invisible inconsistencies help with the problem of solving the paradox of the arrow for middle-sized objects? Electrons can be moving, even though they belong to a body that is at rest!

[9] I would like to thank Chris Campbell for his grammatical corrections.