In Defense of Sentimentality

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Robert C. Solomon, In Defense of Sentimentality, Oxford University Press, 2004, 316pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 019514550X.

Reviewed by Rick Anthony Furtak, Colorado College


This volume is the second in a series collectively entitled The Passionate Life, which promises to bring together a definitive edition of Robert Solomon's essays in the philosophy of emotions. While its chapters (most of which have previously been published in one form or another) deal with a range of topics in aesthetics, moral psychology, and the philosophy of religion, the common thread from beginning to end is a focus on the affective dimension of life. If this qualifies as a philosophical category in its own right, it is largely due to the work of Solomon himself, who over the past thirty years has arguably done more than anyone else to establish the philosophy of emotions as a major area of inquiry.

One of the chief aims of the book is to defend the importance of being emotional: against those who harbor distrust toward particular emotions or toward emotion in general, Solomon mounts a counterattack meant to demonstrate that emotional sensitivity is an ethical virtue, valuable in itself and essential to any meaningful human existence. This goal is especially prominent in the first and last essays of the collection, which (according to the author's preface) serve to lay out the concerns of the volume as a whole. "In Defense of Sentimentality" and "On Kitsch and Sentimentality," the two chapters in question, are united in their denial that the term "sentimentality" ought to have negative or pejorative connotations. This goes against the practice of using the word to describe emotions that are inauthentic, facile, excessive, self-deceived, or distorted. According to Solomon, this critical use of the word "sentimentality" is nothing but a convenient way of expressing a more comprehensive bias against emotion as such, and especially against a class of emotions variably described as the "sweet" or "tender" sentiments. He puts forward the remarkably strong claim that, in spite of prevailing opinion to the contrary, "there is nothing wrong with sentimentality" (4).

In taking this unapologetic stand against those who have argued that sentimentality involves a wistful turning away from reality, or an objectionable misrepresentation of the world, Solomon puts himself in the position of having to defend any and every instance and type of emotion that has typically been stigmatized as sentimental. A reader who is sympathetic to his project in many respects may reasonably feel that such a position cannot be rendered plausible and coherent, or at least that Solomon does not succeed in proving his extreme thesis that all opposition to sentimentality is unjustified. After all, he makes reference throughout the book to the Aristotelian ideal of appropriate emotional response. If it makes sense to speak of being angry at the right person, for the right length of time, and to the right degree, then it must be possible for our emotions to "go wrong" (244) -- that is, by virtue of being inappropriate in a given situation. It would be strange to suffer more grief over the death of a goldfish than over the death of a close friend (81), and there is something wrong with a person who "romanticizes" the raw experience of grief in abstraction from its object (87). Likewise, our feelings toward the natural world ought to include an awareness of its violent side (151), not only of such properties as the cuteness and innocence of prairie dogs. These are just a few of Solomon's own examples of what another philosopher might describe as sentimentality. His examples of flawed emotion are proof that Solomon is not as indiscriminate as his thesis would lead us to believe. Why, then, should he maintain that the very attempt to distinguish more and less defective instances of emotion is motivated by a generic prejudice? On the contrary, anyone who acknowledges the intentional content of emotions (as Solomon does) has a reason to care about the difference between cases in which our emotions go wrong and cases in which they are right on target.

A philosophical defense of the emotions does not have to be such an all-or-nothing affair, and Solomon himself clearly appreciates the need for Nietzsche's distinction between those emotions that are worth having and the ones that weigh us down with their stupidity. It is a frustrating strategy, then, when he continually punts to making vague allegations about the pervasive bias against emotion -- a conversation stopper if ever there was one, since it only changes the subject and does nothing to explain why a particular kind of criticism should not be made. One may be convinced by Solomon's essay defending the desire for vengeance as an emotion that arises from a tacit sense of justice, but this is no reason to abandon the belief that there is such a thing as patriotic kitsch, in which non-tender emotions (such as hatred for "the enemy") are sentimentally evoked. When Solomon reports his own "suspicion" that a specific criticism of sentimental emotion is based on an anti-passionate bias in the critic, this should not change the mind of anyone who suspects that the criticism is valid (242). There is a difference between interpreting things in the best possible light and seeing only what one wishes to see, and Solomon should not be so quick to concede that all emotions involve a distortion of the world, or that "what love sees and thinks is mostly nonsense" (173). We are guilty of a kind of deception when we project onto the world whatever qualities would justify the emotions that we most enjoy having. This is subtly but crucially different from viewing the world in light of our concerns: in the former case, we invent a pretext for feeling what we have already decided to feel. In the latter, emotional attunement provides the framework through which we experience situations that are not themselves subject to our will.

Although emotions, like other intentional states, must in some sense be answerable to mind-independent reality -- as Solomon points out, I cannot be angry at you for stealing my car if I know that my car has not been stolen -- it is also true that our experience of the external world is affected by the emotional state of mind with which we approach it. In other words, our emotional comportment toward the world has a decisive influence on the nature of our experience: even though it would be naïve to imagine that we have the power to "create" our own reality, the lens through which we are looking goes some way toward determining what it is that we see. This dialectic between the subjective and the objective aspects of emotional perception is among the more intractable facts that must be explained by any philosophical account of the passions. On this topic, Solomon has some insightful remarks to offer, although these are not very well represented by the title of his book. At one point he distinguishes between idealization and illusion, the former being a kind of glorification of the object, the latter a falsification of it (227). This is a welcome alternative to the idea that all emotions are equally distorting, and it captures the sense in which love provides us with a kind of knowledge that is not available to the dispassionate observer. When I love someone, it is likely that I am especially able to appreciate her good qualities, because these are glorified in the light of my radiant gaze; and this is not equivalent to admiring a falsified image of her while failing to see who she really is. Love does not "make anything true," but it does transform our whole perspective, enabling us to see things that were previously hidden from us. To be passionately engaged, then, is to adopt "a positive attitude in which all sorts of possibilities open up that may not have been so evident before" (160). For this reason, gratitude for existence is a good emotion to cultivate, regardless of whether or not it can be "objectively" justified.

What is most distinctive and valuable about this volume is its development and exploration of the idea that practical reason has an emotional basis. This is consistent with Solomon's well-known view that the passions are rational, but it is a more radical claim: here, in his most recent work, he appears to be defending the position that rationality itself is passionate. The criteria by which we judge an emotion to be more or less rational are not external standards which stand on their own apart from our world of concern; rather, it is our emotional attunement that provides the framework within which we make rational judgments and evaluations. This means that our point of view is admittedly colored by our subjective biases, but it is an illusion to believe that any perspective is free of affective coloring. Even if we try to adopt a stance of apathetic detachment, this has its own emotional tone. As Solomon convincingly argues, philosophical appeals to dispassionate reason are often marked by callousness, resentment, insensitivity, distrust, or "pigheadedness in the pursuit of a proof of the obvious" (23). The fashionable notion that philosophy is best understood as a "problem-solving" technical or scientific discipline is rejected by Solomon as a misguided ideal, since there is simply no such thing as a transparently objective vantage point. The virtue of emotional sensitivity is thus important not only for moral perception, but for the attainment of humane awareness such as a philosopher ought to be pursuing. In Defense of Sentimentality does not merely outline a philosophy of the heart; in defending the legitimacy of passionate experience, it also makes an articulate plea in favor of putting the heart back into philosophy.