In God's Shadow: Politics in the Hebrew Bible

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Michael Walzer, In God's Shadow: Politics in the Hebrew Bible, Yale University Press, 2012, 232pp., $28.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780300180442.

Reviewed by Sam Fleischacker, University of Illinois, Chicago


One way to distinguish political theorists is by style. Most write very abstractly, while a few eschew abstraction, regarding an accessible, richly illustrated, style as integral to the kind of theory to which they aspire. This division crosses methodological and ideological lines. John Rawls and Jürgen Habermas, Joseph Raz and Chantal Mouffe, Gerald Gaus and Judith Butler all write about their subject as if from a towering height, which helps them develop systems of great scope and power, but also makes extraordinary demands on the attentiveness of the reader. Isaiah Berlin and Hannah Arendt are two outstanding examples of theorists who made it their business, instead, to write with a straightforward elegance that expressed their interest in communicating with non-professionals, not just fellow theorists -- their commitment to the idea that politics is and must be everybody's business. Perhaps the greatest living practitioner of this second style of political theory is Michael Walzer.

Which is to say that Walzer's new book on the politics of the Hebrew Bible -- In God's Shadow: Politics in the Hebrew Bible -- is a delight to read, and can be put on one's night-table next to a favorite novel, not just slotted into the time reserved for professional work. Nor are its stylistic virtues irrelevant to its content. Walzer has always described what he does as social criticism rather than theory, an immanent critique of society and politics rather than the high theorists' transcendental critique, and his conversational style is integral to that project.

Yet this is not as much a work in social criticism as some of Walzer's other writings. First and foremost, it is a project in intellectual history: an attempt to figure out the views of politics held by the authors of the Bible themselves. Walzer surveys every type of writing that bears on politics in the Bible, and asks about the political interests or ideology of every type of Biblical writer. There are chapters on the covenant imagery and the various legal codes in the Torah, and on the views of holy war, kingship, international politics, and messianism in the Deuteronomist historians, the prophets, the priests, the members of the royal courts, and the wisdom writers. Each chapter is wide-ranging and erudite, drawing on extra-biblical sources, rabbinic commentary, and contemporary biblical scholarship, yet also limpid and concise, making just a few points that bring out sharply the main lines of the political ideology under consideration. Some of these points are unsurprising, if well put (for instance, that the Biblical ideology of kingship is most striking for what it does not include: a cosmic role for kings (58, 60, 66)); others seem novel: for instance, that wisdom literature, because rooted so little in the past, also has a "fragile and problematic" hold on the future (159, 160-61).

Along the way, Walzer manages to puncture some favorite myths championed by other contemporary scholars, who want either to claim the Hebrew Bible as a source for their own ideals or use it as a whipping boy for what they dislike about Western culture. Examples of the former include the idea that ancient Israel had a formal constitution (dismissed on 52-3), that the prophets were proto-pacifists (see 104), and that the "elders" constitute a democratic element in ancient Israelite governance (192-3). An example of the latter is the idea that the Hebrew Bible, because of its monotheism, is uniquely intolerant and militant, and invented the notion of holy war. Walzer dismisses this claim by citing an ancient Moabite inscription describing a holy war of exactly the sort mandated in Deuteronomy (35); one might add that most ancient polytheistic nations fought aggressive wars, invoked the blessing of their deities on their wars, and treated those they conquered in bloody and oppressive ways.

Occasionally, Walzer also says things that link what he sees in the Bible to his own pre-occupations as a political theorist. He repeats the claim he made in Interpretation and Social Criticism that the prophets are social critics, for instance (86). As noted earlier, this is a category in which he has long placed his own work, and on the importance of which he has written several books. In The Company of Critics, he makes clear that it includes activists (Rosa Luxembourg), novelists or playwrights (Albert Camus, George Orwell), and journalists or op-ed writers, as well as philosophers. In Interpretation and Social Criticism, he says that we are all critics of our societies; the professional critic, whether in the form of a prophet or a playwright or a philosopher, simply gives more intense and focused attention to an aspect of social life familiar to all of us. There is here an implicit reproof of philosophers, urging them to recognize the many ways in which societies criticize themselves without following the model established by Socrates and Plato: without ascending to a rational peak that transcends all traditions and local norms. Biblical prophets provide a better model of the responsible and effective social critic, for Walzer, because they are embedded in the society whose measure they are trying to take; they do not float in a space beyond social ties, spinning out theories that they insist must be relevant to all societies, regardless of historical circumstance.

The fact that a social or political critic is most effective when embedded in his or her society's local norms comes out also at other points in this book.  For instance, Walzer contrasts the bland admonitions of the book of Proverbs, simply stating that one should take care of the poor, with "the power of the Deuteronomic command" that describes the poor person as "thy brother" and calls on us "not [to] harden thine heart, nor shut thine hand" from him (155). By working within a universal frame, Walzer says, the Bible's wisdom literature lacks the power of the Deuteronomistic and prophetic insistence on understanding their community as a nation, a group united by ethnic and historical ties and not just by shared principles. Walzer notes, approvingly it seems, that the messianic vision of the prophets maintains the integrity of nations. Even if, when that day comes, "nation shall not lift up sword against nation," there will remain nations, not just a worldwide cosmopolitan order (182-3).

Walzer finds one theme running through all the materials he considers: a thoroughly apolitical, even anti-political worldview. The one thing shared by priests, prophets, wisdom writers and practically every other contributor to the Hebrew Bible, according to Walzer, is an indifference to politics, even an opposition to it. The Deuteronomist sees kings as having no positive role other than leading the Israelites into battle (56-8); the prophets are "at war with politics" (67) and "never call upon ordinary Israelites to act politically" (82); the authors of the wisdom literature are concerned with everyday life rather than politics (167); and no biblical writer takes an interest in public deliberation (73) or attaches "value to politics as a way of life" (125). "Politics," writes Walzer, "secular, everyday politics, the management of our common affairs, is not recognized by the biblical writers as a centrally important or humanly fulfilling activity." (186) They are unconcerned with constitutional structures, with the procedures by which political officials are or should be selected, with the proper roles or aims of these officials, or with the proper aims of statecraft in general (81, 86). This is the leitmotif of Walzer's book, hinted at in its title: in God's shadow there can really be no politics. "The reason for [the] largely missing politics" in the Bible, says Walzer, "probably lies in . . . the . . . idea of divine sovereignty. In a sense, every political regime was potentially in competition with the rule of God." (202) The strong monotheism of Israelite thought, the idea that God alone should rule, "denies autonomy to political actors" (66): precludes them, certainly, from having any interesting role.

One can sense a certain disappointment in all this, as if Walzer had once hoped to find far more in biblical politics. Towards the end of the book, he remarks that

had a secular political history been written, or . . . preserved [in ancient Israel], we would probably know far more than we do about Israel's constitutional arrangements, the limits on royal authority, the rival power centers, the nature of political conflict, the relations of local and national officials. (198)

There is something sad in this remark, as if Walzer would really like to have been working on materials that did delve into the nitty-gritty of ancient Israelite politics. It is hard to imagine that he would have embarked on his decades-long investigation into the Jewish political tradition -- he has edited a whole series of books under that title -- had he thought from the outset that its founding document rejects or dismisses politics altogether.

But are there not some advantages to this dismissive attitude toward politics? Is there not something mysterious and intriguing about a culture that cares so little about political affairs? Might not that orientation even teach us something useful about politics -- provide us with an "apolitical politics," as Walzer at one point himself suggests? (66).

To get a better sense of what this might mean, let's begin by distinguishing three versions of the apolitical stance that Walzer finds in the Hebrew Bible.

First, much of the Bible is concerned with law rather than policy. Walzer acknowledges that the Bible devotes a great deal of attention to law, and its interpretation and enforcement by courts. It may describe no political deliberations, but there are numerous accounts of people making contracts, or being punished for crimes, or coming to a judge to settle a dispute. And the prophets, while never calling for political or social change, do rebuke their rulers over and over for not following the law: for defrauding the poor, or for violating laws against idolatry. This focus suggests a belief that good governance flows from eternal verities, rather than changing in accordance with the exigencies of the moment. In one sense, such a belief is indeed apolitical -- it sets law up in opposition to "policy," and to any conception of the polis as an entity with a contingent past, and a fragile future -- but in another sense it amounts just to a certain view of politics, not a rejection of it.

Second, there is the "accommodationist" strand that Walzer finds in the prophets' attitudes towards international politics, and in the attitudes of the priests towards Judea's imperial rulers. This flows from something more fatalistic, an attitude that history is in God's hands and it is futile to try to resist it. That is different from a principled rejection of historical contingency in favor of eternal law, and it really does amount to an indifference towards politics, a belief that we cannot expect to accomplish much politically.

We have still not arrived at an apolitical politics, however. That is to be found just in the third strand that Walzer identifies, the "fiercely antipolitical radicalism" (88) that he locates in some of the prophets, and in the messianism that arose from this strand of prophecy. Here we have an attitude that does not amount either to an indifference to politics or a commitment to the superiority of law over policy. Rather, it arises from the thought that there is something evil in every attempt of some human beings to gain power over others, and that human relations are ideally based instead on the worship of a God who humbles us all. A politics of this sort -- a politics that sees politics itself as inevitably idolatrous and tyrannical -- is one that sets forth an ideal of human relations as free of all violence, and conducted among equals who recognize each other as such. This is the antipolitical politics of the Diggers in 17th-century Britain, of Samson Raphael Hirsch and Hermann Cohen in late-19th century and early 20th-century German Jewry, and of religious pacifists and anarchists everywhere.

With this distinction in hand, it becomes clear that some versions of the "missing politics" of the Hebrew Bible remain interesting today, while others do not. The focus on law rather than policy, and especially the idea that law is properly an eternal structure that does not vary with time and place, had an honorable legacy in medieval Christendom but is hard to maintain in our modern, highly historical age; it is also ill-suited to democracy, as Walzer intimates. The accommodationist view has never been very interesting; it is found generally among people who are either cynical about politics or see themselves as too weak to accomplish much. But the antipolitical radicalism of some of the prophets is a distinctive, unusual way of conceiving the relationship between ideals and power that has had a long-lasting impact, and that endures today even among people with no commitment to theistic religion. One can see it in Gandhi's account of nonviolence, and to some extent in the forms of political practice recommended by the likes of Hannah Arendt and Michel Foucault, in which public discussion and performance are at the heart of an admirable politics, while all attempts to acquire power are suspect. There is reason to rebuke advocates of this view for their politics of aestheticism and for failing to take real responsibility for their society's condition.  But there is also something plausible about the claim that all power corrupts, that all attempts to use power will come to grief on the shoals of unintended consequences, and that people should therefore simply exemplify their ideals and hope that their example may inspire others to do likewise. The claim is certainly plausible enough that its roots in the admonitions of the Hebrew prophets would have been worth examining. And Walzer is likely to have had interesting thoughts on those roots.

One reason why, even if he has had these thoughts, he did not share them with his readers may be that he tried to restrict himself to the thought of the Hebrew Bible's authors alone, as opposed to its uses in later religious traditions. That choice is itself rather a shame, however. Taken alone, the Hebrew Bible is the product of a fairly unimportant ancient people, who ruled a small strip of land and did not distinguish themselves in city-building or technology, mathematics or medicine, art or philosophy. Had their one great book not founded two major religions -- and inspired many more -- it might still rank as one of the finer literary creations of the ancient world but would probably not arouse any other interest. What makes the Bible interesting is the influence it has had when taken as God's word, and that is something that comes out only via the prisms placed on it by later Judaism and by Christianity. That is to say: the meaning of the various writings in the Hebrew Bible changes once the rabbis and the founders of the church take their proper author to be God. It is a mistake to limit that meaning to what its original human authors intended, or their audience heard: that is not the meaning that has given these writings the resonance, including the social and political resonance, they have come to have.

The mistake I have in mind comes out sharply when Walzer talks about the Bible's legal codes. He describes the three major codes in the Torah as clearly inconsistent with one another, and asks how such "divergence [can] be explained when a single divine lawgiver rules eternally." It cannot, he concludes: "From a theological point of view, the three codes are literally inexplicable." (17)

But from many theological points of view, the (apparent) contradictions among these codes are not inexplicable at all. If one assumes that a God who gives law must intend for it to be easily followed, then Walzer is right. But God might instead have meant for human beings to wrestle with what divine law means, to argue with one another over it and come up with creative interpretations of it. That could be a way of urging us to take up the law autonomously rather than blindly. Or it might encourage us to develop our moral and religious imaginations. Or it might foster a relatively undogmatic, flexible community filled with the "strange open-ended legal conversations" that Walzer himself rightly says characterize the oral law of later Judaism (33). Any and all of these are purposes that a benevolent and wise God might readily have for us -- hence reasons why such a God might give us several different codes, which it is our job to reconcile.

In any case, there is no reason to assume that the three codes are flatly inconsistent with one another. The enormous hermeneutic project that constitutes the Talmud is precisely an effort to show that they are not inconsistent, and at least some of the readings by which the rabbis harmonize apparently conflicting texts are ingenious and plausible. To be sure, they are not readings that a modern historian is likely to favor: they attribute an extremely subtle significance to details in the construction, sometimes even the spelling, of the text that it is hard to imagine an ancient Israelite having in mind. But for the rabbis the true author of the text -- its ultimate author, however it may have been recorded and transmitted over time -- is God, and there is no significance too subtle to attribute to a divine author.

By the same token, once the Bible is seen as the work of an eternal God, and not a historically-limited human being, there is nothing absurd about supposing that it was really meant to teach Platonic philosophy, Christian soteriology, or the esoteric teachings of the Kabbalah. Philo and Augustine, Maimonides and Aquinas, Meister Eckhart and Isaac Luria all feel free to read their respective philosophical commitments into the Bible because they believe it is God's word, and God must mean it to express (whatever they consider to be) the ultimate truth about the universe. Which is to say that reading the Bible "from a theological point of view" transforms its meaning; far from rendering apparent contradictions "literally inexplicable," it turns them into literal invitations, from the Author, for a variety of (non-literal) readings.

And in this light, it is no longer so clear that the Bible does foster an indifference or hostility toward politics. Anarchists and pacifists may still find good sources for their anti-political radicalism in the Bible, but that is not the only reading to which the book now lends itself. The readings of the prophets that helped underwrite liberationist theology, for instance -- in the Jewish philosopher Hermann Cohen, as well as the later Christian groups who described themselves that way -- may look far-fetched from a historical perspective, but are not so from a theological one. Social conservatives can legitimately quote the Bible as well. The range of plausible readings of the Bible, when placed in a theological frame, is extremely wide. They can certainly not be limited to the thought that those who see themselves as living "in God's shadow" should regard politics as futile or meaningless.

It would have been nice to see Walzer explore these possibilities, especially since his extraordinary knowledge of the history of political thought puts him in a position to say something about a wide variety of the Bible's uses. But perhaps that is an inappropriate complaint about a book that succeeds so well at its own aim: telling us, clearly and elegantly, what the people who wrote the Bible themselves are likely to have believed about politics.