In Mendel's Mirror: Philosophical Reflections on Biology

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Kitcher, Philip, In Mendel's Mirror: Philosophical Reflections on Biology, Oxford University Press, 2003, 378pp, $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 0195151798.

Reviewed by Samir Okasha , University of York


In Mendel’s Mirror brings together seventeen of Kitcher’s most important essays on the philosophy of biology written over a period of nearly two decades. Some of the essays are classics, known to virtually every student of the subject. Others, particularly the more recent ones where Kitcher discusses topics such as genetic determinism, the evolution of culture and the implications of human genomics, are less well-known. What is most striking about the book is its uniformly high quality; although the volume runs to nearly four hundred pages, there are no space fillers here – each essay is substantive, penetrating and authoritative. Although the collection ranges widely – Kitcher has written about virtually every topic in mainstream philosophy of biology, and many non-mainstream ones too – many of the essays are thematically linked. In a number of places Kitcher returns to a subject he first wrote about in the 1980s and offers us updates of how he sees the issues twenty years down the line.

The collection opens with ‘1953 and All That: A Tale of Two Sciences’, (1984), Kitcher’s masterful examination of the relation between classical and molecular genetics. That essay rejected the idea that classical or Mendelian genetics can be or has been reduced to molecular genetics, an idea widely accepted by many geneticists at the time. Kitcher argued that the key concepts of classical genetics, such as ‘gene’ and ‘allele’, cannot be defined in the language of molecular biology, and thus that the explanatory principles of classical genetics are in an important sense autonomous of, rather than reducible to, molecular biology. Since this essay was written nearly 20 years ago, it is interesting to see how Kitcher’s argument looks in light of recent advances in molecular biology. In ‘The Hegemony of Molecular Biology’ (1999), we find Kitcher standing by and extending his anti-reductionism, for broadly his original reasons. Since not all interesting biological regularities can be captured in molecular terms, it follows that “macrolevel work in development and physiology” cannot be replaced by molecular studies.

Kitcher’s scepticism about the possibility of molecular biology’s usurping traditional ‘whole organism’ biology is surely well-placed. However in places one feels that he may be attacking a strawman, to some extent at least. The thesis that “molecular biology is all the biology we need”, which Kitcher counters so effectively, is one which even the most enthusiastic molecular biologist would be unlikely to endorse, at least publicly. That having been said, defenders of the Human Genome Project have been wont to suggest that DNA sequence data is the key to understanding all aspects of organismic form; Kitcher is among the many philosophers of biology to have pointed out the implausibility of this idea. Interestingly, though, he is less suspicious of human genomics than some authors, accusing Richard Lewontin of having ‘overstated’ the case against the HGP by claiming it to be devoid of all scientific value. Here as elsewhere we find Kitcher advocating a sensible, middle course between two opposing extremes.

Thanks primarily to the pioneering work of David Hull in the 1970s and 80s, questions about biological classification – the assigning of organisms to species and higher taxa – have loomed large in philosophy of biology. Together with Michael Ghiselin, Hull argued that the notorious species problem had proved so intractable for a metaphysical reason: biologists had failed to recognise that species are individuals, with births and deaths, rather than kinds. Hull’s ‘individuality thesis’ met with widespread approval among philosophers and biologists alike. In ‘Species’ (1984), Kitcher tried to counter this orthodoxy, insisting that it is simply a matter of convention whether one chooses to regard species as individuals or kinds. In that paper, Kitcher defended a ‘pluralistic’ approach to the species problem, arguing that there is more than one legitimate way of assigning organisms into species; which way is appropriate depends on the interests of the biologist. In ‘Some Puzzles about Species’ (1989) Kitcher returns to the species problem, further defending his view that the Hull/Ghiselin individuality thesis is not the panacea it is widely thought to be, and addressing a range of further conceptual issues about how evolving lineages should be chopped up into discrete species. Both papers on species are important and still relevant, but neither is easy reading. Though Kitcher is admirably well-versed in the relevant biology, his readiness to deploy the full range of tools of analytic philosophy in the pursuit of conceptual clarity is likely to alienate many biologists, impressive though the paper is from a philosophical viewpoint. (This is a complaint that could be made against a number of the essays.)

Kitcher’s 1985 book Vaulting Ambition was a trenchant attack on the then-fashionable discipline of human sociobiology, pioneered by E.O. Wilson. Though Kitcher did not reject out of hand the idea of applying Darwinian theory to human behaviour, he argued that Wilson’s work fell far short of strict scientific standards, and was beset by shoddy argumentation, anecdotal evidence, and conceptual confusion. Human sociobiology as practised by Wilson was ‘pop science’, he argued. Sociobiology has reformed itself considerably since Wilson’s early formulations, become more sophisticated, and now markets itself under the label ‘evolutionary psychology’. In ‘Pop Sociobiology Reborn: The Evolutionary Psychology of Sex and Violence’ (2002), Kitcher returns to the fray, attacking theorists such as David Buss, Randy Thornhill, and Craig Palmer, who argue respectively that various aspect of human mating preferences (Buss) and the disposition of men to rape women (Thornhill and Palmer) are Darwinian adaptations, innately hard-wired in the brain, and explicable in terms of the fitness increases they would have bestowed on our hunter-gatherer ancestors. Kitcher finds little of merit in these ideas, arguing that Buss, Thornhill and Palmer are by and large repeating the methodological sins of traditional sociobiology: inventing speculative Darwinian stories to explain allegedly universal features of human behaviour/psychology whose existence is anyway moot, failing to gather sufficient empirical evidence, and not considering alternative hypotheses.

Kitcher’s critique of evolutionary psychology is compelling though perhaps slightly harsh. Evolutionary psychologists typically distinguish their project from traditional sociobiology by saying that while sociobiologists tried to explain specific human behaviours in Darwinian terms, their focus is on the proximate psychological mechanisms that cause behaviour, not the behaviour directly. Few would deny that this constitutes a genuine advance, in principle at least, for it allows recognition of the obvious point that most interesting human behaviours are mediated by complex psychological factors, even if they have an underlying genetic component. Indeed Kitcher makes this very point himself, in ‘Developmental Decomposition and The Future of Human Behavioural Ecology’, (1990), insisting that a Darwinian approach to behaviour must involve “some conception of the ways in which forms of behaviour are bound together by proximate mechanisms and developmental processes” (p. 313). However in his critique of Buss, Thornhill and Palmer, Kitcher insists that their focus on the selective value of human psychological traits is hopelessly incomplete, because until we are told “how the traits posited will issue in behaviour, we can’t make any judgment about their selective impact” (p.342). Evolutionary psychologists could reasonably protest that they are being forced into an impossible situation. If they focus on behaviour directly, they are accused of ignoring the fact that behaviour is the outcome of psychological mechanisms; if they focus on those mechanisms themselves, they are accused of failing to specify a close enough link between the mechanisms and the behaviours they issue in. One is left wondering how any application of Darwinian theory to human behaviour could satisfy Kitcher’s standards of methodological hygiene.

A number of the more recent essays in the volume, including ‘Race, Ethnicity, Biology and Culture’ (1999) and ‘Utopian Eugenics and Social Inequality’ (2000) reflect Kitcher’s growing interest in the social and ethical implications of modern biology. But best of the most recent pieces, for my money, is ‘Battling the Undead: How (and How Not) to Resist Genetic Determinism (2000)’, originally published in a volume honouring the work of Richard Lewontin. Lewontin has been a tireless critic of genetic determinism in its variant guises, and of associated ideas about the heritability of many human behavioural traits. Kitcher detects an interesting shift in Lewontin’s position over the years. According to Kitcher, Lewontin’s original contribution consisted in explaining why the methods used by behavioural scientists to show that a trait is ‘genetic’ rather than ‘environmental’ in fact showed nothing of the sort. (Lewontin’s famous 1974 paper ‘The Analysis of Variance and the Analysis of Causes’ is the locus classicus here.) But more recently Lewontin has favoured a more radical line, similar to that of developmental systems theorists such as Susan Oyama, which rejects the consensus view that all traits result from the interaction of genes and environment. In place of this interactionist consensus, Lewontin and Oyama argue that the causal influences on a trait cannot be divided into two types, ‘genetic’ and ‘environmental’, because this is an excessively ‘dualist’ (Oyama) or insufficiently ‘dialectical’ (Lewontin) way to think about causation.

Kitcher argues that Lewontin’s original critique of genetic determinism was closer to the mark than the more recent radical view. To my mind Kitcher is right, though advocates of developmental systems theory will doubtless disagree. But whatever one’s view on this controversial matter, Kitcher’s careful attempt to show why the rejection of the interactionist consensus is unnecessary is impressive, and lays down a challenge that Lewontin, Oyama and others must surely respond to. To all those readers of Lewontin who, like the current reviewer, do not fully accept the relevance of the Marxist and ‘dialectical’ twists which Lewontin tries to give to his biological and philosophical insights, Kitcher’s critique makes comforting reading.

The final essay in the volume, ‘Born-again Creationism’ (2002), finds Kitcher revisiting an old battleground. His 1982 book Abusing Science, written at the height of the controversy over ‘creation science’, presented an authoritative, comprehensive, and philosophically rigorous account of just what was wrong with standard creationist arguments. This was no mean feat, since although biologists all agreed that creationism is badly flawed, few had succeeded in saying exactly why, and many of their critiques relied on a woefully simplistic, often Popperian, philosophy of science. In ‘Born-Again Creationism’ (2002), Kitcher directs his fire at two leading ‘neo-Creationist’ authors, Michael Behe and Philip Johnson, both who have tried to resuscitate the argument for design in a modern format, and whose arguments, on the surface at least, appear considerably more sophisticated than those of the early ‘creation scientists’. Unlike Kitcher’s critique of evolutionary psychology, there is little to disagree with in his assault on neo-Creationism. It is to Kitcher’s credit that he still has the time and patience to expend energy exposing the likes of Behe and Johnson.

In sum, In Mendel’s Mirror performs the valuable service of collecting together some of the finest essays in philosophy of biology written in the last two decades, and gives a fascinating insight into Kitcher’s intellectual development over that period.