In Other Shoes: Music, Metaphor, Empathy, Existence

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Kendall L. Walton, In Other Shoes: Music, Metaphor, Empathy, Existence, Oxford University Press, 2015, 295pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780195098723.

Reviewed by Robert Stecker, Central Michigan University


The best way to approach an essay by Kendall Walton is to suspend your disposition to resist theses that flout apparent common sense and to heighten your sensitivity to qualification and subtle distinctions. If you do this, you will end up questioning your conception of common sense and, on occasion, you will accept propositions that, out of context, you might have called crazy. This is one reason why Walton is such an important philosopher, one whose work, based in the philosophy of art, has influenced so many other disciplines in philosophy and beyond.

The fifteen essays contained in this volume on the topics mentioned in the subtitle, as well as expression in the arts, fictionality, ineffability, mental simulation, narrators and musical personae, fictionalist metaphysics, and emotional responses to fiction, don't always require a philosophical 'suspension of disbelief'; it would be highly misleading if I suggested that they do.

But some do. A claim that seems to have challenged many readers of Walton is that "our emotional responses to works of fiction do not involve, literally, fearing, grieving for, admiring fictional characters." (275) This negative claim and Walton's complex and subtle positive alternative are the subject of the last two essay, "Fearing Fiction" and "Spelunking, Simulation and Slime," which are two of the best known pieces included here. For that reason I won't say anything more about them,except that, whether you end up agreeing with Walton or not, suspending your disposition to resist long enough to appreciate the argument should change your conception of what is common sense with regard to this topic.

While I am quite sympathetic to Walton's views about emotionally responding to fiction, there were several essays that posed a similar challenge for me. We will get to some of them presently, but first let us return to an orderly recording of the contents of this volume.

"Empathy, Imagination, and Phenomenal Concepts" is the only newly published piece Unlike many earlier pieces reprinted here that attempt to extend the empire of imagination, make-believe and the fictional to various, sometimes unexpected, domains, this essay argues that the imagination, though often involved in empathy, is not essential to it. Rather what is essential is "using some aspect of one's current mental state as a sample to understand another person . . . i.e., judging or experiencing the target person to be feeling 'like this.'" (9-10) Imagining can sometimes generate the sample state, but other things can do -- such as being in a situation similar to the target.

"Fictionality and Imagination -- Mind the Gap" is similarly refreshing because its central claim is a partial retraction of a lynchpin of Mimesis as Make-Believe. The central notion in that work is fictionality -- truth in a fictional world -- and the claim is that a proposition is true in a fiction just in case there is a prescription to imagine it. Walton still thinks that this is a necessary condition for fictionality, but he produces numerous examples here that claim to demonstrate it is not sufficient. While I didn't buy all of the examples, I believe the conclusion is exactly right.

When we read literary works, it is very natural to take them as uttered by someone: a narrator, speaker, the actual writer -- someone other than the reader. Quite a lot of philosophy of literature, as well as literary criticism, is built on this idea. There are quite a few writers who would extend something like this idea to all the arts, including music. Several essays in this volume seek to provide an alternative to this approach, sometimes only in the sense of supplementing it, but sometimes in the sense of supplanting it.

In "Thoughtwriting -- in Poetry and Music," Walton suggests an alternative way of taking poetry (and music). We can, and sometimes do, take poems as texts for expressing our thoughts rather than those of an author, narrator or utterer. Some poems, Walton suggests, are primarily intended for this purpose. Music can sometimes be treated in analogous ways. A plausible example that to some extent offers a bridge between poetry and music is popular songs. But none of this denies the appropriateness of taking literary texts as uttered by someone other than ourselves.

"Projectivism, Empathy, and Musical Tension" moves more toward supplanting that approach for musical works, at least in the case of some of the aesthetic properties we attribute to such works. Consider music we would classify as nervous. We don't do this because we hear the musical expression of a nervous 'persona,' but rather because certain features of the music, some of its dynamic qualities, say, infect us with a kind of uneasiness that we might simply refer to as 'this' state of mind (reemploying the account of empathy discussed above). We might then project 'this' feeling back on the music, without the additional thought that this feeling belongs to any particular person. Walton ultimately wants to extend an account like this to the pervasive phenomena of musical tension and release.

If the point of "Projectivism" is that we project feelings (nervousness, tension) that music causes in us back onto their source via a process closely related to empathy, the essays "Listening with Imagination: Is Music Representational?" and "What is Abstract about the Art of Music?" develop a closely related point viz. that music calls for imaginative introspecting. More specifically, Walton claims that we imagine of our auditory sensations that they are "particular stabs of [emotional] pain, particular feelings of ecstasy, particular sensations of well-being, etc." (225) Musical works induce listeners to imagine experiencing these emotions, and when we speak of musical expression, we are often referring to this sort of imaginative self-awareness. This is again an alternative to the idea that musical expressiveness is to be understood in terms of emotions expressed by a persona heard in the music.

One issue that these three essays raise -- along with "Two kinds of Physicality in Electronic and Traditional Music," which I don't have space to discuss -- concerns Walton's considered view of expression and expressiveness in music. The latter two essays discussed above treat it differently than "Projectivism." They also put the experience of expression in the game world of the listener rather than the work world. Not so for the "Projectivism" view. The two approaches are not incompatible, so Walton could say expressive phenomena are not all of a piece. I suspect that is his considered view.

As their titles indicate -- "What is Abstract . . . ?" and "Listening with Imagination . . . " also discuss the nature of musical representation as well as the sense in which music -- or pure music -- is abstract. These are closely related matters because one might think that the more representation a work contains, the less it will be abstract, and vice versa. But Walton argues for a different view. Music's abstraction, he suggests, is more a matter of the way it represents than its being free of representation. One might hear a struggle in a passage or whole movement of a piece and say that the music represents a struggle. Walton would for the most part be willing to say that. But is it representing the general property of being a struggle or a specific struggle? Is it represented from a third or first person perspective? Is something being said about the struggle? It is often impossible to characterize musical representation in the ways that natural languages normally allow, and it is this distance from those ways that is part of what makes music both abstract and representational in some sense.

I finally come to two essays that were the most challenging for me. "Existence as Metaphor?" is primarily concerned to give an account of existential statements that is consistent with the thought that when we say 'Falstaff exists' or 'Falstaff doesn't exist' we are in neither case talking about Falstaff. When we make existential statements, there is always an implied pretense that that we are referring to something and predicating existence of it. Since there is in fact no such property, all utterances of existential statements contain an element of pretense. But those in which we use empty names -- like 'Falstaff' -- involve the further pretense that we are referring to something in using the name. We pretend to refer to something and to predicate a property to it, or if we don't actually pretend, we indicate such a possible game of make-believe. The point of the pretense is to enable us to actually assert something true or false (that is why existential statements are statements). If I say that Falstaff exists, I assert (falsely) that attempts to refer of a certain kind (the Falstaffian kind) are successful, and if I say that Falstaff doesn't exist, I assert (truly) that this kind of referring attempt fails.

Making existential statements always involves pretense, but it does not involve metaphor. However, as this essay as well as "Metaphor and Prop Oriented Make-Believe" make clear, existential statements and at least some metaphorical ones involve pretense. In both cases, one may pretend to make an assertion of a certain kind, thereby actually asserting something of a different kind. Further, both involve a similar kind of pretense that Walton calls "prop oriented." This is pretense or make-believe for the purpose of the cognition of the props rather than for grasping the content of the make believe. When we speak of the saddle of a mountain, assert that argument is war, or speak of male or female plumbing fixtures, we suggest or call to mind games of make-believe that involve taking a ridge connecting two mountains as a saddle, argumentative behavior as acts of war, or plumbing fixtures as sexual organs. Issuing a metaphor needn't involve actively engaging in the pretense, but it does operate by 'suggesting' such games.

It is with Walton's view on metaphorical and existential statements that I was most challenged to exercise a 'suspension of disbelief.' Walton is not the first to propose analyzing existence statements in terms of reference, but do we really engage in all that pretense -- or at least indicate a game of make-believe in which it occurs -- whenever we assert that something does (or does not) exist? Would philosophically unsophisticated speakers even be in a position to do these things while knowing all along there is no existence property? And when I say that so and so attacked my argument or refer to a ridge of a mountain as a saddle, do I suggest, if not engage in, a pretense? Not convinced, but -- especially on the matter of metaphors -- still considering.

One of the amazing things about this volume is how much ground it covers, and how much of this ground is integrated within its many individual papers. In the Preface Walton lists a dozen topics that he covers, and it is striking how many papers discuss several of these topics. For their richness alone each of the essays collected here is worth reading -- and rereading.