In Our Best Interest: A Defense of Paternalism

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Jason Hanna, In Our Best Interest: A Defense of Paternalism, Oxford University Press, 2018, 271pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190877132.

Reviewed by Andrew I. Cohen, Georgia State University


Liberals typically treat freedom as a fundamental value in political morality. They then often argue that paternalism is an unjustified restriction on liberty. Paternalism is interference with a person's choices against or without her endorsement in order to protect her from harm. Liberal critics sometimes object to paternalism because it gives power over our choices to persons who seldom deserve it, often abuse it, and rarely apply it correctly. Even if paternalism can be effective, liberal critics often complain it disrespects us as persons. It infantilizes by usurping a person's authority over her life and denying her the opportunity to be a full arbiter of her destiny.

On Jason Hanna's account, such complaints about paternalism are unwarranted. He writes in this careful book, "there is nothing distinctively objectionable about paternalism" (ix). Indeed, Hanna argues, liberals should find paternalism entirely congenial. Many "paternalistic rationales" (37) provide significant reasons in favor of intervention in a person's decisions or liberties.

Hanna's arguments for paternalism are immensely compelling. He may well convince many liberals that paternalistic acts and policies are justifiable. His rigorous defense of paternalism should become a touchstone for future discussions of the issue. As I note below, however, there might be some reasonable persons for whom paternalism is indeed "distinctively objectionable."

This is a book about reasons, or, more precisely, about what sorts of considerations are reasons for action or inaction on another's behalf, without or despite her agreement. Hanna calls his position "pro-paternalism." According to pro-paternalism, it is a reason for an act or policy that it would promote a target's "generally admissible interests" (15-16). Such interests are those that otherwise generally count in favor of an act or policy. A target's interests in sadism (even if they can be satisfied without violating rights) might not qualify. Depending on one's substantive account of the proper scope of government power, a target's interests in living virtuously also might not provide reasons for government intervention in her conduct (14-15; ch. 4).

When acts or policies interfere with another's self-regarding harmful conduct, they do not necessarily violate any liberal concerns. For instance, paternalism need not treat persons with disrespect, violate their rights, manipulate them, impose values, impede self-development, or risk draconian expansions of government power. Instead, as Hanna argues, "it is always a valid reason in favor of intervention that it would advance some of a person's interests and, moreover, that intervention is permissible when, all things considered, it serves the target's best interest (without wronging any third parties)" (228). Sometimes people will better comply with reason when others interfere with their choices or actions. In those cases, liberals' typical objections to paternalism fail.

Many complaints about paternalism misfire because they purport to be about paternalism but are in fact about inept or unwarranted paternalism. Consider for instance worries that paternalism invests the state with power it is sure to abuse. Paternalism, Hanna argues, is about how advancing someone's interests might justify intervention. It is not about what sorts of restrictions apply to the states considering or implementing paternalist measures. Suppose we show that drug laws in the United States systematically disadvantage persons of color. As Hanna might note, this is not the start of an argument against paternalistic drug laws. It is the start of an argument against the discriminatory design and application of paternalistic drug laws.

Other complaints about paternalism threaten to prove too much. Critics might say paternalism disrespects persons by conveying the view that they are unable to make correct choices. Hanna notes several problems with this position. Among them is this: people show a status quo bias. If, for instance, seat belt legislation is insulting, the sting of the insult has faded for nearly everyone. Surely the objection to paternalism as insulting cannot rest on such contingent factors. Perhaps instead the worry is that paternalism is inconsistent with our status as beings with the two moral powers Rawls identifies: the capacity for a sense of justice and the capacity to form and revise a conception of the good (Rawls 1993, 19). Hanna convincingly tackles such objections. Paternalists need not deny their targets have the second moral power. They might simply deny that their targets will reliably decide prudently (79). But if it is objectionable for one to act on that basis, then much conduct we accept becomes problematic, e.g., requiring advance drafts of papers of our (mature, adult, autonomous) students (80) or requiring that regulatory agencies, doctors, and pharmacists serve as gatekeepers for access to certain medications. Especially worrisome for the anti-paternalist, though, is that the "insult" argument might apply not just to our abilities to behave prudently but also to our abilities to behave justly. Intervention to prevent or deter injustice need not treat a target as if she lacks the first Rawlsian moral power. Surely we accept some (indeed, many) such restrictions. Insofar as any such intervention is disrespectful (a conclusion Hanna resists), then, as he again notes, "there would be nothing distinctively objectionable about paternalism" (83-4).

Even the most strident anti-paternalist must acknowledge that sometimes it is permissible to intervene with a person for her own good. Mill (1978, sec. V) famously provides the example of someone about to walk across a damaged bridge. We may stop the person -- even "seize him and turn him back" -- to avert the danger to him. This is no restriction on liberty, Mill claims, because liberty "consists in doing what one desires, and he does not desire to fall into the river".

In light of Mill's bridge example and related cases, some theorists draw a distinction between "hard" and "soft" paternalism, where the former is intervention with a competent adult against or without her assent, but the latter is intervention with a person who suffers some [suitably specified] ignorance or incapacity. Among the signal achievements of Hanna's book is a series of excellent arguments meant to show that this distinction is dubious at best and fails to provide any sound basis for typical anti-paternalism. Joel Feinberg had worried that the term "soft paternalism" was unfortunate since the relevant interventions do not restrict voluntary conduct (1986, sec. 17.3). To avoid confusion he kept the term. On Feinberg's account, to require motorcyclists to wear helmets would be impermissible hard paternalism, but it would be soft paternalism to require that, before getting on a bike, they attend a safety course and decide whether or not to wear a helmet (Feinberg 1986, sec. 20.8). Taking the course ensures their choices are sufficiently voluntary. Hanna warns that such a position is unstable. Either the course is justified as a way of advancing a person's interests despite her wishes (and so, again, there would be nothing distinctively objectionable about paternalism), or it is impermissible hard paternalism since it restricts a person's liberty to determine the conditions under which she may make choices (159). Similarly, it is difficult to show that decisions to smoke (with no second-party impacts) are immune to interference. Such decisions nearly always exhibit some impaired deliberation or impaired attention to the weight of one's own values. If intervention is justified for some cases of ignorance or incapacity, then it is difficult to show there is something distinctively problematic about intervening in a person's choices to prevent her from harming herself.

Hanna leaves the notion of "intervention" somewhat underspecified. The intervention involved in stopping Mill's bridge crosser might be different in kind, and not merely in degree, from the interventions involved in restricting the size of cups of soda, restricting the manufacture or sale of tobacco products, or requiring that consumers purchase health insurance or save for retirement. Part of the difference hangs on who the paternalist agent is. When the agent is a state, there are important questions about the legitimate uses of political power. Of course, paternalism is not distinct to states. One might intervene with friends or family who are akratic dieters by hiding food, distracting them, shouting, cajoling, jeering or cheering, and so forth. These would be paternalistic interventions insofar as they employ nonrational means to get a target to respond to reasons when the target would otherwise likely not do so (see, for instance, Scoccia 2018, 19-20). Hanna would welcome any such intervention provided it advances a target's best interests consistent with whatever justice requires or forbids. Some such forms of intervention might be appropriate depending on the circumstances and the relationships among the relevant parties.

Hanna discusses what some have recently called "libertarian paternalism," which involves encouraging prudent choice by arranging targets' "choice architecture" in ways that appeal to foibles or cognitive biases. Hanna argues it might be permissible, for instance, to provide nutritional information in visually appealing ways, arrange cafeteria selections to privilege healthier choices, and assign insurance and retirement plans to make prudent choices a default. None of these is necessarily manipulative since each of these can help targets to better act on the best reasons. Consequently, Hanna argues, nothing about libertarian paternalism shows paternalism is necessarily distinctively problematic.

Hanna's arguments are immensely compelling. If what matters is simply that people comply with the best reasons, he is right: there is nothing distinctively objectionable about paternalism. There is, however, an alternative account about what matters in political morality. On this alternative, persons are not mainly platforms to promote value. Instead, persons are due respect as beings who define and live lives of their own. Early on, Hanna sets aside a related view about paternalism. Pro-paternalists, he writes, "must reject the claim that intervention can wrongly violate or disrespect a person's autonomy even when it is in her best interest" (13). This brackets an important but reasonable view.

If we take one another as free and equal, then what we do to and for each other must be mutually justifiable. Of course, political theorists have debated extensively what such and related views might mean. Passing over those details, let us say that we may only treat others in ways they can reasonably accept.

Consider then a person who wants to live her life as she sees fit. It might be true in some circumstance that paternalists could help her to achieve her substantive good by overriding her imprudent self-regarding choices. However, as William Glod (2013, 413) notes, this agent is committed to living a life with the discretion to make such choices and bear the consequences. She objects to paternalism not for instrumentalist reasons but for agency-based ones. Certainly, she does not want to fail. But she prefers the freedom to fail from her decisions over a context where she is subject to some coercive or manipulative arrangement that prevents her from making the relevant choices (Glod 2013, 418). This is part of her substantive view of the good life. This person may demand respect as someone who, as Nozick once put it, has her "own life to lead" (Nozick 1974, 34). This person demands that others forbear interfering with her without or despite her consent merely to enhance her welfare. Her view hardly seems unreasonable.

Hanna begins to anticipate a view such as this but seems to miss its force by focusing instead on what best promotes an agent's interests. Consider smoking. Most smokers do not want to die from cancer and many might want to stop smoking. However, some smokers might reasonably prefer a world where they have the freedom to smoke and suffer the consequences to a world where because of paternalism they are not free to suffer the consequences of smoking. Hanna and other pro-paternalists might find it implausible to suppose that reasons to prefer a world free of paternalism are infinitely stringent, especially when welfare gains are so readily attainable from relatively low-cost paternalistic interventions. The anti-paternalist might reply, however, that she believes prospective welfare gains absent her consent are excluded from the balance of reasons that may count for others in determining what they may do to her. This, too, hardly seems like an unreasonable position. If a reasonable and rational person might have such a view, then paternalism would seem to be distinctively objectionable insofar as its actions or policies appeal to norms this person reasonably fails to endorse. That does not mean others must stand by and do nothing when such an anti-paternalist behaves imprudently. They may, as Mill notes, remonstrate or reason with that person, or persuade him to change his ways. Of course, if his acts transgress others, then he is liable to interference. "His own good, either physical or moral, is not a sufficient warrant" for interference (78, pt. I).

Hanna and other pro-paternalists might point out that such anti-paternalism risks challenging many policies we commonly accept, such as requirements to contribute to retirement or buy health insurance, prescription drug laws, and all manner of state regulations such as those governing food, transportation, and occupational safety. This might show not that anti-paternalism is mistaken but that many liberal soft paternalists are insufficiently or inconsistently anti-paternalist. Perhaps paternalistic rationales do not permit many common public policies. There may be other reasons for such policies, but paternalistic ones might not count.

Hanna has provided a careful and compelling criticism of anti-paternalism and a rigorous defense of paternalism. This important book presents novel and formidable challenges to liberals. If advancing interests is what matters, Hanna is surely correct. There would then be nothing distinctively objectionable about paternalism. If, however, someone's reasonable substantive view of the good rejects unqualified advancement of her interests, paternalism might be distinctively objectionable. Critics and proponents of paternalism would do well to study this book closely in any case.


Feinberg, Joel. 1986. Harm to Self. New York: Oxford University Press.

Glod, William. 2013. "Against Two Modest Conceptions of Hard Paternalism." Ethical Theory and Moral Practice 16 (2): 409-22.

Mill, John Stuart. 1978. On Liberty. Edited by Elizabeth Rapaport. 8th edition. Indianapolis: Hackett Pub Co.

Nozick, Robert. 1974. Anarchy, State, and Utopia. New York: Basic Books.

Rawls, John. 1993. Political Liberalism. New York: Columbia University Press.

Scoccia, Danny. 2018. "The Concept of Paternalism." In The Routledge Handbook of the Philosophy of Paternalism, edited by Kalle Grill and Jason Hanna, 11-23. Routledge.