In Our Name: The Ethics of Democracy

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Eric Beerbohm, In Our Name: The Ethics of Democracy, Princeton University Press, 2012, 352pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780691154619.

Reviewed by Melissa Schwartzberg, New York University


When we find ourselves appalled by our representatives' actions, should we feel responsible for their behavior? What can we do to reduce our complicity with the actions that the government putatively takes on our behalf? These are the questions that animate Eric Beerbohm's thoughtful and expansive book. Though group intention and collective responsibility constitute themes of major import within moral philosophy, political theorists have not regularly turned to this literature to explain democratic commitments. Beerbohm does so with elegance and verve, helping us to assess our obligations as citizens, and to understand the consequences when we, or our representatives, fall short.

The basic premise of Beerbohm's argument is that because democratic citizens are causally connected to political outcomes -- through sins both of commission and omission -- they bear moral responsibility for unjust decisions. At first blush (and even second), it may seem implausible to understand citizens as causal agents of government decisions in large representative democracies. We are several steps removed from policy-making. As such, political scientists often describe voters as "rationally ignorant," because of the costs associated with acquiring political knowledge. Even voting is irrational, because our probability of being decisive in an election is infinitesimal. So can we possibly imagine that we play a causal role in political outcomes? It is true, Beerbohm suggests, that one's individual ability to change the outcome of an election is "atomic." (52) But in voting, each of us does play an instrumental role even if we do not make a "difference" in the outcome, since our votes alter the final tally (75). This is not trivial: the margin of votes may well affect whether the president is able to assert he has a mandate for change, for instance.

This is only one link in the chain Beerbohm draws between individual causation and moral responsibility. When we deliberately act in concert with our fellow citizens to bring about injustice, we are coprincipals in wrongdoing. More commonly, however, we act in a more indirect fashion, choosing representatives who act unjustly and thereby "sponsor[ing] the state exercise of power that produces political injustice" (64); as such, we bear moral responsibility as "accessories" to injustice.

That we share moral responsibility for the wrongdoing of our representatives is intuitively plausible. If we knowingly choose representatives in order to promote injustice, it seems right that we should be held jointly culpable for their actions. But it is likely only a rare voter who deliberately seeks to promote injustice, and so the notion of accessory is more important. Causation and responsibility are attenuated on this story, and rightly so. Consider the circumstances in which we vote to elect representatives. With one ballot, we typically try both to render a retrospective assessment of an incumbent and to make a prospective judgment about whether the incumbent or a challenger would perform better in the next term. In rendering the prospective decision, we don't know whether our representatives will have to choose whether or not to go to war, nor do we have a clear picture of the policy agenda, which will change both in response to pressing needs and to a yet-undetermined political context. Moreover, we know we have a very limited capacity to assess her actions in office. Many of her activities in committee, or her private advocacy and logrolls, are hidden from us. We also know that even apparently unjust public votes might have resulted from a bargain designed to reach a just outcome on a more significant issue. So we know we are quite limited in our capacity to evaluate, let alone control, our representative's performance in office.

In a large representative democracy, then, we might reasonably resist the claim that we are in any meaningful way accessories to injustice. We possess such limited capacity to ensure that our representatives act justly that it is difficult for us to feel culpable for their decisions. But Beerbohm tells us we are wrong to feel this way. Indeed, we are wrong even when we vote against an unjust representative: in that case, although we do not cause wrongdoing, we still bear responsibility for injustice insofar as we support and receive benefits from the institutions in which he is embedded.

Because we are always implicated in governmental injustice, Beerbohm argues, a key goal of citizens should be to reduce our "complicity footprint," (10) to take affirmative measures to try to cancel out the injustices to which we are accessories. Note that withdrawal from political life, through refusing to vote or becoming willfully ignorant, is not a morally acceptable option. We can become accessories in injustice through our inaction -- through failure to take measures to reform unjust political institutions -- and through moral as well as political ignorance, whereby we may fail to recognize unjust actions. So we must take positive measures to remedy these potential liabilities, and the most important activities are "cognitive" in character.

Citizens are obliged to take political actions that are sufficiently meaningful to mitigate responsibility for injustice, though these prescribed tasks should not be too burdensome, given the myriad private obligations of citizens, and the division of labor between citizens and representatives. As such, Beerbohm argues in chapter 4 that deliberation, which many theorists take to be a core duty of democratic citizenship, is supererogatory. The citizen instead primarily has the "cognitive responsibility" to form and revise beliefs about justice and the common good, because by doing so she reduces her probability of being an accessory to injustice. This duty is not truly minimal, insofar as the citizen cannot discharge it through "low-information rationality," relying on heuristics or other cues to help her decide. She needs to develop a set of rough-and-ready principles of justice sufficient to help her make political decisions grounded in moral reasons, and then to test her commitments. But this reflective activity of scrutiny can be accomplished through private conversations or even just reading arguments that challenge rather than confirm her prior beliefs.

While these principles need only be "usable" -- they do not have to amount to a fully worked-out theory of justice (chapter 7) -- they also serve a critical role in structuring the relationship between the representative and constituents. This relationship is rooted in equality; the value of democracy lies in its ability to produce relations among citizens as equal coauthors and cosubjects, as Beerbohm argues in chapter 2. Obviously, this would appear to press against the hierarchical structure of representative government. Indeed, the ordinary activity of legislating does not require representatives to tether themselves to constituents' policy preferences; on most of these issues, citizens will not know enough to form preferences worth articulating, generating a clear division of labor. But Beerbohm argues citizens are obliged to share these principles with their representatives as "protected principles -- a class of exclusionary reasons to lawmakers that constitute their basic principles of justice" (197). Initially, it seems that these reasons are preemptive; they substitute for the legislator's own principle of justice, and contour her decision-making, placing the citizens in a relationship of authority over her. Beerbohm then sensibly softens this claim; in keeping with his egalitarian relational logic of democracy, instead, legislators must "assign equal initial weight to their principles and those of individual citizens," (222) rather than deferring to whatever principles their constituents might endorse. (One might note that there remains some question how, absent deliberation, citizens' "usable" principles might cohere, or even how such principles would be communicated to representatives, given the cognitive rather than expressive conception of citizens' duties.)

Failure to develop these principles of justice is a central way in which we can become unwittingly complicit in our representatives' decisions. But it is not the only or perhaps even the most substantial means by which we do so; again, causality matters. Beerbohm defends the "Democratic Principle: x is liable for causally contributing y to political injustice through democratic role z." (240) A set of questions to Beerbohm might concern the relative causal responsibility -- and thus blameworthiness -- of differently situated citizens: the citizen who votes for an apparently just candidate who, as representative, ends up supporting an unjust war that could not have been foreseen time of election; the citizen who opposes that representative in favor of a minority candidate who she knows stands no chance of election; or the citizen who does not vote at all because she believes all the candidates are prone to injustice and does not want to be an accessory to wrong-doing?

Moreover, while our causal role in electing representatives may be fraught with peril, once we move outside of the ballot box, our efforts to engage in more deliberate reason-giving or to encroach upon the activity of legislation through the initiative process become even riskier. Beerbohm reminds us that we thereby become coprincipals of injustice rather than mere accessories (257). (It is difficult to reconcile Beerbohm's defense of nonoptional participation in citizen juries, later in chapter 10, with this claim.) But where we observe injustice being done, Beerbohm argues, citizens are obliged to protest, to work to "offset," those injustices.

The book's focus on individual responsibility and the causes of blameworthiness will strike some readers as reminiscent of the "Al Chet" of the Yom Kippur service, absent an absolving divinity: for the sin which we have committed through our ignorance; for the sin we have committed through speech; for the sin we have committed with knowledge; for the sin we have committed through the use of coercion. A corresponding objection might be that the focus on individual responsibility -- with reducing our own complicity footprint -- encourages a narcissistic, and potentially neurotic, attitude toward keeping our own hands clean. Beerbohm's elegant philosophical argumentation might have been enhanced at points by more sustained focus on the institutional structures of representation, with an aim to improve the likelihood of just decisions, rather than on reducing citizens' complicity in injustice. Yet the book provides us with a breathtakingly expansive, and ultimately compelling, account of citizens' duties within representative government. In Our Name is a distinctive and important contribution to democratic theory.