In Praise of Blame

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George Sher, In Praise of Blame, Oxford University Press, 2006, 160pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 0195187423.

Reviewed by Brad Hooker, University of Reading


Blame is often blamed for souring people and sparking or prolonging conflict. It is also often accused of having conceptual presuppositions that render it incoherent. But what exactly is blame? What is its relation to character, principle, responsibility, and reactive attitudes? Sher's In Praise of Blame answers these questions succinctly and persuasively.

Sher first considers the Humean idea that one is blameworthy if and only if one has a bad character. Sher distinguishes four different versions of this idea about blame and character.

First, there is the idea that people are blameworthy if and only if their bad acts issue from general vices they have. Sher points out that this view won't do because sometimes people who don't have any general vices nevertheless do bad things. Such acts by such agents are out of character. But an agent who does a bad act is blameworthy even if the act was out of character. Thus, the first view is mistaken to hold that someone is blameworthy only if his bad act issues from a general vice.

The second view about blame and character that Sher considers holds that someone is blameworthy if and only if his bad act issues from a disposition to act in this way "in some significant range of cases". Imagine someone who is generally honest, brave, and kind, but not when dealing with his ex-wife (p. 23). If someone is generally kind, brave, and honest but not when dealing with his ex-wife, does he have a vice we can name? Even if he does not have the general vices of dishonesty, cowardliness, and cruelty, he does have a disposition to be dishonest, cowardly, and cruel in some significant range of cases (i.e. when he is dealing with his ex-wife). So, on the second view about blame and character that Sher considers, this agent is blameworthy. Hence the second view doesn't fall victim to the objections that refuted the first view.

But Sher argues against the second view. His argument employs examples of agents who do bad things, but in highly specific and rare circumstances. Admittedly, in these highly specific examples the agents have various dispositions that interact to produce their behavior. So the agents' acts are "firmly rooted" in their characters. But their characters do not contain a disposition to act badly "in a significant range of cases". Yet these agents are blameworthy for their bad acts. These serve as counter-examples to any view that a necessary condition for blameworthiness is that the agent's bad act issues from a disposition to do such acts in some significant range of cases.

Having rejected the first two views about blame and character as too restrictive, Sher considers a third view. This view holds that someone is blameworthy if and only if she is disposed to act badly in one or another set of conditions. But consider someone who would behave badly but only in appalling circumstances, which in fact she never meets. According to the third view, she is just as blameworthy though she never actually does the bad acts in question. This view casts the net of blameworthiness too widely, in Sher's view. What adds force to his objection to this view is his point that maybe every actual human is such that, in sufficiently terrible circumstances, he or she would do terrible acts (p. 26). It is implausible to contend that, as the third view implies, all are equally blameworthy, although only some have done the especially terrible acts.

Can the three views be combined into a plausible theory? Sher explains that the answer is that they cannot. What keeps them from being plausible is precisely that they overstate the importance of character. As Sher concludes, "the amount of blame that someone deserves when he behaves badly depends not on how typical of him the bad behavior is but simply on how bad it is." (p. 29)

The following chapter contains Sher's own theory of the structure of blameworthy action. From the preceding discussion, we see that for Sher the badness of actual acts, and not just the badness of character traits, is central to the account. Sometimes we hear the injunction "blame the act or decision, not the person who did it". Sher opposes this idea. But he accepts that some people find puzzling why blameworthiness attaches to the agent of a bad act, and not just to the act he did, or to the decision he made to do the act. The answer, according to Sher, is that, on the one hand, intentional actions are "traceable to" the interaction of some subset of the agent's beliefs, desires, and fine-grained dispositions, and, on the other hand, the agent's identity is at least partly constituted by his beliefs, desires, and dispositions (pp. 45, 49, 64-5). Given the tightness of the connection between the act and these identity-constituting elements of the agent, blame for the agent for the act can hardly be surprising.

Sher accepts that people can be blamed for having moral vices, or what he sometimes calls morally bad character traits. The next chapter explores a common argument against this view:

Premise 1          No one deserves blame for anything beyond his control.

Premise 2          People generally lack control over their bad traits.

Conclusion        People generally deserve no blame for their bad traits. (p. 51)

Sher notes that many philosophers attack premise 2 of this argument. These philosophers accept that I do not now have control over my current traits, but they contend I could earlier have done things to prevent the development of the vices I now have, and so I should be blamed for not having done those things. This argument won't do, however, because, as Sher points out, many bad traits are developed before someone reaches an age where he could reasonably be held responsible for his own moral education (pp. 54--5). So if we are to reject the above argument, we had better attack premise 1.

This is just what Sher does, with impressive success. He admits, of course, that sometimes a bad act does not reflect badly on the agent. This is true when I am innocently ignorant of some fact that gives me a relevant reason, as in when I am ignorant of some rare allergy had by the person to whom I give a tulip. But this is very different from the case where I have a bad character trait. For "to have a bad character trait just is to be systematically unresponsive to the corresponding class of moral reasons." (p. 58) Surely I can be blamed for being systematically unresponsive to a class of moral reasons, even if I cannot be blamed for preventing the development of my moral vices.

But that idea seems to conflict with the contention that it cannot be fair to blame someone for something he cannot help (p. 60). This contention about fairness is opposed by the following powerful argument. At least often, agents who did bad acts are blameworthy for having done them. So it is fair to blame these agents for these acts. Yet at least many of these blameworthy acts were the inevitable result of the character traits of agents who did them. And "once we have acknowledged that it is fair to blame people for bad acts that flow automatically from bad traits over which they lack control, we can hardly deny that it is fair to blame them for those bad traits themselves." (p. 63)

The next chapter shows what is wrong with three popular views about what blame is. One of these is that to blame someone is to express moral disapproval in order to improve conduct. This view is unacceptable for a number of reasons. First, of course blame may not be expressed. So blame and its expression must be two different things. More importantly, if the expression of blame does improve conduct, this is often because of the content of what is expressed, not merely because what is expressed is a negative or even hostile attitude (p. 74).

The second is that blame is constituted by the belief (not necessarily expressed) that the wrongdoer has marred his moral record or stained his soul. One problem with this view is that many people would deny that this is what they believe when they believe someone is blameworthy. Another perhaps more decisive problem is that this view renders inexplicable why the blameworthy are naturally and correctly the object of angry and hostile reactions, rather than pity (p. 78).

The third is that blame is (not a perception of objective blameworthiness but) a negative emotional reaction to what the person blamed has done. This view is most closely associated with P. F. Strawson, who took it to be a brute fact about us that we often hold one another responsible and have accompanying reactive attitudes towards each other. Sher argues against this view on the grounds that it is too naturalistic to account for the idea that blame can be deserved.

Having explained what blame is not, Sher takes the next chapter to tell us what blame is, though his account weaves together threads of each of the accounts he has rejected. He certainly accepts that blame includes a belief that someone has acted badly or has a bad character. But it also involves a desire about the present and past that people not have acted badly and not have bad characters. When people have acted badly, this desire is frustrated. When we are the ones who acted badly, this desire is reflected in feelings of guilt and in apologetic expressions of a current responsiveness to moral requirements we wish we had not transgressed. When others are the ones who acted badly, the desire is characteristically reflected in reproaches aimed at eliciting a similar responsiveness in others. But the dispositions to feel guilt or anger and to reproach or apologize are "causally dependent on, and are unified only by their common origins in, the relevant beliefs and desires" (p. 116). So blame is constituted by belief-desire pairs, but these explicably cause "a characteristic set of behavioral and affective dispositions" (p. 137).

Sher's final chapter is "in praise of blame". He argues that blame is too closely tied to morality to purge. Nor should we want to purge it. The very reasons that justify moral principles also justify both the desire that those principles not be flouted and the blaming of whoever does flout them (pp. 130, 132). Morality is practical in the sense that "the primary task of morality is to guide action" (p. 123). Sher adds that moral requirements are universal, omnitemporal, overriding and inescapable (p. 123). These formal features taken as a group, Sher argues, imply that full acceptance of a moral principle is "conceptually bound up with" desiring that the principle not have been violated (p. 124). Since the belief that a moral principle is justified entails the desire that the principle not have been violated, and this belief-desire pair constitutes blame and gives rise to the familiar affective dispositions, whatever justifies the moral principle in the first place also justifies blame as a response to its violation.

Sher's book is careful and penetrating. Everyone interested in blame should study it.