In Praise of Desire

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Nomy Arpaly and Timothy Schroeder, In Praise of Desire, Oxford University Press, 2014, 316pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199348169.

Reviewed by Richard Holton, University of Cambridge


In recent years, desire has had a hard time of it. In this pleasingly forthright and readable book, Nomy Arpaly and Timothy Schroeder come to its defence. That said, the domain of its defence remains limited. The authors do not contend that the moral facts themselves have their basis in desire; nor do they claim that moral beliefs are desires; nor that we should aim to satisfy desires. They remain non-committal about both normative ethics and metaethics. The focus is rather on moral psychology. Here, though, desire does get a lot of work to do. In summary, and omitting various details, Arpaly and Schroeder start by defending the thesis that to act for a reason is to act on an intrinsic desire. From this they move on to explicitly moral theses: first, they argue that to have good will is to have intrinsic desires for the right ends, conceived of in the right way. Then, making use of this account of what a good will is, they argue that agents will be praiseworthy for performing good actions if and only if they perform those actions on the basis of their good will and that the agents will be virtuous if and only if they have significant good will and lack ill will.

The salient opponents here are those who think that this central role should be played not by desire but rather by something more cognitive: reasoning, deliberation or the like. The opening chapter provides a case against this kind of view, arguing, most centrally, that it cannot be that acting for a reason always involves deliberation, for, since deliberation is itself an action, this would lead to a regress. Clearly there is something to this criticism, but despite the authors' best efforts, it remains somewhat inconclusive. It is always hard to make regress arguments stick, and there are various defences left open to the opponent, several of which the authors sketch.

However, all this is rather by-the-by since this is not the heart of the book. What is done really well, and what we can all be grateful for, is the positive case for the desire-based theory. As Arpaly and Schroeder point out, most recent philosophers who have defended the central role of desire have nevertheless wanted to restrict the relevant desires to those that pass some further test: they are the desires that we would desire to have, or that we believe we would have if fully rational, or some-such. Arpaly and Schroeder make no use of such devices, remaining instead with a simple notion of intrinsic desire and nonetheless showing how they can still give a plausible account not just of acting for a reason and of moral worth but also of a host of other phenomena too: of love and care, of modesty, of prejudice, and of the kind of inner struggle that accompanies akrasia and other conflicting attitudes.

To get a sense of how the account works, consider their response to the Huck Finn case. Huck, they say, is praiseworthy for protecting Jim from the slave-catchers since he shows good will in so doing. He shows good will because he acts in virtue of his intrinsic desire to do the right thing, thought of in the right way: in this case, they suggest, because he intrinsically desires that everybody be treated with respect, which here requires that Jim be saved from slavery. It doesn't matter that he also thinks that Jim is the property of a slave owner and intrinsically desires that this property relation be upheld; that isn't what drives his action and so in this case is irrelevant to the moral assessment of his action. Note, though, that this defence of Huck does require a particular interpretation of his motivation. If Huck were just moved by an intrinsic desire never to turn a friend in to the authorities, then, since this presumably is not the right thing to do in general (imagine the friend is set to do some dreadful thing that the authorities would prevent), Huck would not be thinking of his action in the right way and so would not be praiseworthy. Whether in this case he would be blameworthy would depend on whether this motivation would show a bad will, or else moral indifference, since they hold that the latter is also sufficient for blameworthiness. (Praiseworthiness and blameworthiness are hence not symmetrical.) Plausibly it would show the latter: in privileging friendship above all else, Huck would be indifferent to the moral consequences of his actions.

If desire is to fulfil this central role, then we need to know what it is. In particular it won't be very helpful to be told just that it is whatever it is that moves us to action: such an all-embracing account would make it hard for them to make the discriminations they need to make. Here Arpaly and Schroeder do have an account. The central claim, familiar to readers of Schroeder's earlier book, is that neither motivation (a push to do the desired action) nor affect (pleasure or similar in response to the action or its anticipation) are essential features of desire. Instead, to desire something is for it to be the object of the reward system, that is, of the system -- implemented in human beings and many other animals, by the mesolimbic dopamine system -- that causes the formation of intrinsic desires for objects that are found rewarding. It is the system that, for instance, causes us to form an intrinsic desire for some new foodstuff when we try it and find it rewarding. Typically this will involve pleasure, but it need not, as the case of addiction shows. A great deal of research is indicating that addictive substances can be greatly wanted even though they bring no actual or expected pleasure.

To this extent, then, addiction bears out the authors' claim that desire can be independent of any affective response. Nevertheless, as the authors recognise, addiction does pose a challenge to their account. The problem stems from our moral attitudes. As Arpaly and Schroeder very clearly explain, current work suggests that addiction involves a malfunction in the reward system. Addictive drugs cause an artificial stimulation of the dopamine signal, with the result that the consumption of addictive drugs can cause intrinsic desires for them to spiral out of control. Unlike normal foodstuffs, where an equilibrium is reached when the desires for them are proportional to the satisfaction gained from them, the artificial signal that arises from the consumption of addictive drugs can cause desire for them to continue growing without limit. And that, it seems, is what leads addicts to go on consuming even in the knowledge that the drugs will bring little pleasure and will have a disastrous effect on their lives.

On the authors' account, then, it would seem that addicts, driven as they are by intrinsic desires for drugs that greatly exceed their desire to do the right thing, should instantiate the paradigm of the bad agent. But we do not tend to think of them in that way. To use Arpaly and Schroeder's persuasive example, while we certainly criticise the person who leaves their infant children in a freezing car overnight in order to take cocaine, we probably don't think quite as badly of them as we would think of the person who did the same thing in order to watch a football match. We tend to think of addiction as providing something of an excuse; a partial excuse perhaps, but, given how hard it is to resist addictive desires (a feature which the authors' account explains very nicely), an important excuse nonetheless.

How can Arpaly and Schroeder account for this? The logic of their account would seem to suggest that we are simply wrong in thinking that addiction is an excuse. But this is not the line they take. Rather, they deny that the desire that the addict experiences is as strong as their behaviour suggests. They argue for this on two grounds: first, that addictive behaviour is driven by habit rather than desire; and second that, given the way it works on the reward system, addiction gives rise to great expectations of reward, and when these are unsatisfied they give rise to cravings that are out of proportion to the strength of the desire.

Here I am unconvinced. On the first point: is addiction more habit driven than other behaviours that are not excused? That is far from obvious. Indeed the clinical data suggest that purely habit driven behaviours, like tics, are rather easily overcome once the habit is noticed: making someone aware of a tic is the best way of stopping it, whereas awareness does not, per se, reduce the power of addition. Moreover, is it true that in general we are more forgiving of actions that stem from habit than from desire? Does cruelty, say, become more excusable once it becomes habitual? On the second point: it is clearly true that addiction gives rise to cravings. But that is surely simply the way that strong desires generated by the reward system work. Such desires, when they are unsatisfied, demand more and more attention. That is what a craving is. We have no reason to think that the cravings are out of proportion to the strength of the addictive desires rather than simply revealing that those desires are very strong -- which is just what we would expect.

Of course, one response is simply to withdraw the original moral intuition; perhaps addicts are perfectly culpable after all. But part of why we are reluctant to think this is that they seem to be struggling against something that they find hard to control. This is often taken to be a struggle between reason and appetite. Arpaly and Schroeder reject that picture, as they must given the role that they want desire to play. Instead, their account of inner conflict takes it back to something that is fundamentally a clash between desires even if those desires can be mediated by various beliefs, feelings, and action plans.

They suggest that the neuroscience points this way. I suspect that things are too uncertain here to draw any such conclusions. In the first place inner struggle, especially as experienced by the addict, seems crucially to involve self-control. And the current orthodoxy is that self-control comes not from the dopamine based reward system but rather from a different system in the pre-frontal cortex. Arpaly and Schroeder might counter that this is just a mechanism for implementing the desires generated by the reward system -- one wouldn't exercise one's self-control if one didn't want to -- but two questions remain. First, even if it is true that the self-control system is only deployed on the basis of desire, it may well be that it is needed exactly because that desire is no longer present when the time comes to act. If that is right, then it raises another possibility -- that the current desire to behave badly may be actually stronger than the desire to behave well ever was, but luckily the self-control is strong enough to hold it in place. And that may be why we think of addicts as less blameworthy: in their case the bad desire is so strong that it overwhelms self-control, whereas we are inclined to think that the contrasting desire to see the football match cannot have been so strong, so there it must have been the self-control that was lacking. Could Arpaly and Schroeder incorporate such ideas into their own account? They could certainly say that the person who controls a bad desire by means of self-control has a good will and that they act in a praiseworthy way since their action stems from a desire for the good, conceived of in the right way. But it is not so clear that they could count them as virtuous since their ill will, constrained though it is, outruns their good will. More broadly, we have left behind an account which works only with desire to one that starts to factor in other states.

These reflections on the case of addiction also raise a second concern. As noted, Arpaly and Schroeder identify desire with the working of the reward system, which is realized in us and other animals by the dopamine system. Note the strength of this claim. They do not simply say that this provides one type of desire; they say rather that this is what desire is. As part of their case for this, they point out that those who suffer from Parkinson's, and hence from a compromised dopamine system, lose their motivation to act. They could have reinforced the point by pointing to those rats who are genetically engineered to have no functioning dopamine system at all and who consequently have to be artificially fed, or else stimulated with caffeine, to stop them starving to death. However, here we are concerned with the implementation of desires into action rather than the desires themselves (recall that the authors think that giving rise to action is an inessential feature of a desire). We can concede that all desires need to be implemented via the dopamine system without conceding that all desires are located there. It remains a possibility that while some -- those that derive from reward based learning -- inhabit the implementation system itself, others -- those that are perhaps less primitive from an evolutionary point of view -- come from elsewhere. Why might we want to think that? Return to the considerations about self-control. If all intrinsic desires are fundamentally of the same type, located in the same place, we have something of a mystery about how some get to influence self-control, while others do not. But if there is more than one kind of intrinsic desire -- if alongside those that stem from the reward system there are more cognitive desires, stemming from our judgements of what would be best independently of how rewarding it would be, then these could be the ones that have the influence on self-control. In effect, Arpaly and Schroeder are proposing a kind of psychological egoism: all actions are driven by the reward for the agent. Considerations about what would be best can have no place unless they in turn are rewarding. That may be right; but it may not.

Obviously, as neuroscience currently stands, this is all highly speculative. As Arpaly and Schroeder say in their conclusion, their aim has been to spark a debate rather than provide a final theory. With its integration of considerations from ethics, philosophy of mind and the empirical science, this book provides an excellent beginning.