In Praise of Reason

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Michael P. Lynch, In Praise of Reason, MIT Press, 2012, 184pp., $19.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780262017220.

Reviewed by Dennis Whitcomb, Western Washington University


This fun little book is about certain belief-forming methods, namely, observation and deductive and inductive inference. Lynch's project is to raise and answer three challenges to these methods: that they can't be defended non-circularly, that their aim -- truth -- is somehow deficient, and that they are largely causally inert. These challenges, should they gain widespread traction, might have such untoward results as the erosion of civility in public debate and the weakening of science instruction in public schools. Why teach science as opposed to (say) creationism -- why even reason with people - if observation and inference are causally inert, defensible only circularly, and aimed at a deficient target? Such worries are never far from the surface in Lynch's book, which occupies the intersection of epistemology and political philosophy.

As for the alleged causal inertness of observation and inference, Lynch recounts recent empirical work suggesting that, at least in the political realm, our beliefs are driven by prejudice and passion instead of reason. He resists this suggestion on several grounds and claims that even if it is true, we should still engage (or at least try to engage) in reasoned civil debate because it is an expression of mutual respect.

As for the alleged deficiency of truth, Lynch briefly argues for a certain view about what truth is, a view that merges correspondence theories and epistemic theories.[1] On the basis of this merged view, he defends observation and inference from the challenge that their aim is somehow deficient.

The core of the book is its creative and interesting defense of observation and inference from the charge that they cannot be non-circularly defended. Here Lynch is worried by the epistemic regress problem, understood as a problem about whether any belief-forming methods can be shown to be justified. To see this problem, let M be any belief-forming method. If M can be shown to be justified, then it is via some other method that it can be so shown; but this requires that the other method also be shown to be justified, itself by a third method; a vicious regress ensues. Either the methods go back forever, or they end somewhere, or they circle back on themselves. None of these options seem to vindicate M, the method with which we started. So it seems that no belief-forming method can be shown to be justified. [2]

Given this regress problem, how can we have good reason to socially sanction (by teaching in public schools, giving research money to, and so on) any belief-forming methods as opposed to any others? If every method is susceptible to the regress problem, then why should we teach and fund scientific reasoning, as opposed to other methods that enjoin us to simply consult the Bible? Lynch's answer is that, even if we can't show that there are epistemic reasons to socially sanction any belief-forming methods, we can show that there are practical (i.e. moral and prudential) reasons to do as much.

To see these practical reasons, consider a tool somewhat reminiscent of Rawls' veil of ignorance, a tool Lynch calls "the method game". To play the method game, consider a non-actual world--call it the parallel world. About the parallel world, you know that it appears pretty much the same as the real world appears; it appears to contain tables and chairs and societies and so on. You also know that human psychology in the parallel world operates more or less the same as it does in the real world. You do not know which belief-forming methods are reliable to which degrees in the parallel world. Your job is to choose which belief-forming methods will be socially sanctioned in the parallel world, a world into which (as part of the game) you will soon be moved.

In making this choice, you are not blind to the facts about what you actually know and what your values actually are. You are just blind to the relative reliabilities of belief forming methods in the parallel world, and have the task of choosing belief-forming methods for social sanctioning in that world. In making this choice, you are supposed to advance your own interests (as you see them now in the real world) once you get to the parallel world.

Lynch argues that players of the method game would converge on methods that are

  • natural, in that humans use them automatically or easily,
  • transparent, in that any one person's use of them can easily be double-checked by others,
  • intersubjective, in that their results tend to be judged by whole groups of people, at least in the long term,
  • repeatable, in that they can be used over and over in like cases to give like results, and
  • adaptable, in that they can be applied in a wide range of problems.

He further argues that observation, deduction, and induction all have these properties, whereas methods such as Bible consultation do not.[3] The former methods would therefore be chosen in the game (or at least preferred in the game to the latter ones). Because of that, we have good practical reason to socially sanction these methods -- not just for use in the parallel world, but for use right here and right now in the real world as well.

Or so Lynch argues. With this argument laid out, we can now ask some questions about it, starting with

1. Is it true that observation, induction, and deduction are natural, transparent, intersubjective, repeatable, and adaptable?

It is hard to answer this question, until we get a more precise account of what these methods are supposed to be. For instance, is "induction" supposed to be some sort of straight-rule inference, or some sort of Bayesian conditionalization, or some sort of package of heuristics such as the representativeness heuristic, or what?[4]

We could try to make headway here by using the very properties we're concerned with (naturalness and so on) to individuate the methods whose instantiation of those properties is in question. On this way of looking at it, whatever observation and induction and deduction are, they are automatically natural and transparent and so on, because it is by appeal to these very properties that we specify the nature of these very methods.

But it is doubtful that this approach will yield a satisfying result, because it could be applied to any method at all. For instance, we might try to claim that tea-leaf reading is natural (and transparent and so on), on the grounds that these properties are what individuates tea-leaf reading in the first place. But just saying as much about tea-leaf reading is very unsatisfying. Similarly then, just saying it about observation and induction and deduction is also very unsatisfying. What we want is a more substantive reason to believe that these methods have these properties. Maybe we can find such a reason, but it will be hard to do so until we specify the methods in more detail.

In any case, let us leave such issues aside, and assume for the sake of argument that the answer to our first question is yes: observation, induction, and deduction are natural, transparent, intersubjective, repeatable, and adaptable. Now another question arises:

2. Given the assumption that observation, induction, and deduction are natural, transparent, intersubjective, repeatable, and adaptable, does it follow that we would choose them in the method game for social sanctioning in the parallel world?

Lynch thinks that we would, because we'd have no choice but to use the natural methods, and because methods that fail to be transparent, etc. might be used to our disadvantage. Bible interpretation, for instance, is less transparent than observation. Since we cannot check its results for ourselves, powerful folks in the parallel world might use it to impose their wills upon us, should it be socially sanctioned. It would thus be in our interest to not choose it for social sanctioning in the parallel world. We'd choose observation and induction and deduction instead, which not only can be double-checked by ourselves, but are also more amenable to our long-term planning. Or so Lynch argues.

No doubt, many readers of the book -- sophisticated and urbane academics - would choose their methods as Lynch predicts. But the method game is supposed to justify methods from a common point of view, a point of view disputing parties in a contemporary democracy can all hold. Thus the arguments on offer should appeal to all such people (or at least most of them), not just sophisticated academics. And it is not clear that these arguments really would do that. Religious extremists playing the method game might prefer that Bible interpretation be socially sanctioned on parallel earth. Such preferences might express their attitude that it is valuable to respect God, which attitude they would retain despite the game's imposed blindness to reliability. It is therefore not clear that we -- if "we" refers to all or even most the members of contemporary democracies -- would choose natural, transparent, intersubjective, repeatable, adaptable methods for social sanctioning in the parallel world.

But let us assume for the sake of argument that we would so choose. A third question remains:

3. Given the assumption that we would choose observation, induction, and deduction in the method game for social sanctioning in the parallel world, does it follow that we are practically justified in socially sanctioning them in the real world?

Lynch answers "yes" on the grounds that we are free and equal rational agents. Our status as free, equal, and rational requires that we give one another a certain sort of respect. This respect requires that when we make social policies, we appeal to "public reasons" that are appreciable from "a common point of view". And the method game focuses us on just such reasons. That's why we are practically justified in socially sanctioning, right now in the real world, those methods which in the method game we would choose for social sanctioning in the parallel world.[5]

Just as Lynch's answers to our first two questions are questionable, so is this answer to our third. For one thing, it is not clear that we objectionably disrespect people by appealing (for the purposes of social policy construction) to epistemic or practical reasons they don't recognize as such. To see this, consider a full-blown skeptic about reasons, a person who refuses to believe that anything is a practical or epistemic reason for anything.[6] To the extent that we disrespect such people when we appeal to reasons in guiding our social policy, this disrespect is surely not objectionable. And if we don't objectionably disrespect full-blown skeptics by appealing (for social policy construction) to reasons they don't recognize as such, then perhaps the same holds for skeptics about observation and inductive and deductive inference. The latter skeptics are, after all, quite far along the path towards their full-blown skeptical brethren.

Leaving aside the question of whether issues about respect can underwrite the inference from "we would choose it in the method game" to "we are practically justified in socially sanctioning it in the real world", one wonders what else might underwrite that inference. It is hard to see what would.

Insofar as it is due to their naturalness that we would choose certain methods in the game, our choosing them does not (practically) justify our using them -- in the real world or even in the parallel world of the game itself. The mere fact that something comes naturally does not practically justify it: witness death, disease, dysfunction, and all manner of other things which are quite natural but in no way justified by that fact.

Could the remaining four properties (transparency, intersubjectivity, repeatability, and adaptability), which the methods we would choose in the game are supposed to have, underwrite the inference from "we would choose it in the game" to "we are practically justified in socially sanctioning it in the real world"? I don't think so, because numerous abysmally bad methods have these properties. Such methods include the maximally non-committal method, which enjoins agnosticism about every issue given any possible input; the maximally committal method, which enjoins us to believe every proposition given any possible input; and counter-Bayesianism, which enjoins us to alwaysconditionalize on the negation of our evidence. These methods (and many others) are transparent, intersubjective, repeatable, and adaptable -- and thoroughly silly despite that fact. How can the possession of these properties serve to practically justify a method, when so many silly methods have them? Perhaps these properties can do justificatory work, given the assumption that a method is also reliable. But the whole point of the method game is to remove any such assumption.

To summarize this discussion of our third question, the main points are these. Lynch claims that issues about respect underwrite the inference from "we would choose it in the method game" to "we are practically justified in socially sanctioning it in the real world". This claim is questionable. It is also questionable whether anything else can underwrite that inference, because no such underwriting seems to come from the properties which (so we are assuming) belong to the methods we would choose in the game. Naturalness does not underwrite the inference, because many things are natural yet have no justificatory force. Transparency, intersubjectivity, repeatability, and adaptability don't underwrite the inference either, because many methods have these properties but are nonetheless thoroughly silly. Perhaps we should conclude that nothing underwrites the inference from "we would choose it in the game" to "we are practically justified in socially sanctioning it in the real world".

I've raised three questions about Lynch's book. These questions are intended, not to imply that the book falls flat, but rather to imply that it shines with interest. Like a gifted interlocutor it engages and excites its readers, always drawing them into dialogue (if not always convincing them), and always leaving them better off for it.[7]



Audi, Robert. 1993. The Structure of Justification. Cambridge University Press.

Glymour, Clark and Frederick Eberhardt. 2008. "Hans Reichenbach", The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Summer 2011 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.).

Kahneman, Daniel, Paul Slovic, and Amos Tversky. (1982). Judgment Under Uncertainty: Heuristics and Biases. New York: Cambridge University Press.

Lynch, Michael. 2009. Truth As One And Many. Oxford University Press.

Rawls, John. 1971. A Theory of Justice. Harvard University Press.

Unger, Peter. 1975. Ignorance: A Case For Scepticism. Oxford University Press.

Weisberg, Jonathan. 2011. "Varieties of Bayesianism". In Dov Gabbay, Stephan Hartmann & John Woods (eds.), Handbook of the History of Logic, vol. 10. Elsevier.

[1] Lynch has developed this theory of truth in more detail in several other places in recent years, for instance in Lynch (2009).

[2] Notice that this is an argument about whether we can show that any belief-forming methods are justified, not an argument about whether any belief-forming methods arejustified. The distinction matters to Lynch's project; see pp. 50-52. For relevant background see Audi (1993: 118-125).

[3] At one point (p. 101) he adds memory to his approved list, and at another (p. 97) he seems to also add abduction. But for the most part, it seems to be observation, inductive inference, and deductive inference which he wants to sanction. For simplicity, I'm sticking to those three in the body of this review.

[4] On some varieties of conditionalization see Weisberg (2011); on the straight rule see Glymour and Eberhardt (2008); on various heuristics see Kahneman et. al. (1982).

[5] See especially p. 117 of the book on these points. Also, it is instructive here to compare Lynch's views to Rawlsian justice as fairness in its "Kantian interpretation". See Rawls (1971: 251-257)

[6] See Unger (1975: 197-246) for such a view.

[7] Thanks to Michael Lynch for helpful comments on an earlier draft of this review.