In Praise of the Common: A Conversation on Philosophy and Politics

Placeholder book cover

Cesare Casarino and Antonio Negri, In Praise of the Common: A Conversation on Philosophy and Politics, U of Minnesota Press, 2008, 312pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780816647439.

Reviewed by Jason Read, University of Southern Maine



In Praise of the Common is a difficult book to categorize; neither a collection of interviews nor a collection of essays, it combines both formats, becoming in the end something unique. It is also a book that not only became something different than was initially intended, but which also explicitly states this difference. The book was conceived as a series of interviews that would address the historical background of Antonio Negri’s thought, the tumultuous period of political action and philosophical reflection of the Italian sixties and seventies that remains largely unknown in the Anglo-American world despite the popularity of Empire and Multitude. However, as these conversations developed they became less about the past, less a matter of one person interviewing another about his experiences, and more about the present and future. The interview became a conversation. Unlike an interview, a conversation is determined less by an asymmetry between the one who knows and the one who asks than by the production of some common understanding. In Casarino’s terms, “Conversation is the language of the common” (1).

The shift in the tenor of the conversation also shifted the structure of the book: it is a collection of these conversations framed by three essays, two by Casarino and one by Negri. The shift in the structure of the book is also a shift in its content, from the reflection on a singular experience to a discussion of not only a common frame of reference, but ultimately the common itself. It is at this point that the shift from provocation to completion becomes more than just a trivial matter and becomes a philosophical problem in its own right. How does something singular become common? How does a specific moment, a particular historical experience, become something that can communicate, exceed its location in time and place in order to become something universal? This is both what the book attempts to answer, and what it enacts through its interplay of essay and conversations.

At the center of these essays and conversations is the concept of the common. This term has a long history: its origins predate modernity, as it initially referred to commonly held lands that were the basis of agrarian life, but this has not prevented it from being the term utilized to make sense of the networks of knowledge and communication at the center of contemporary production, and ultimately the capacity to think and communicate. In each case it is a matter of not only that which makes production possible, from pastures to code to language, but that which cannot be possessed, and thus must circulate in order for there to be production. Casarino and Negri’s discussion does not focus on this history, but on the current meaning of the term, in relation to their respective works and overlapping political histories, and in doing so it reveals that its conceptual and semantic dimensions are perhaps as deep as its historical levels.

Casarino’s first essay, which opens the book, introduces the common as both a criticism and a development of Negri’s early works with Michael Hardt. The first of those collectively authored books, Empire, defined the current global and decentered regime of authority and capitalist accumulation, the second, Multitude, defined the subjectivity, or even class, capable of overturning this order. Critics of Hardt and Negri have been skeptical of the relations between these two terms, between order and revolution, especially since Hardt and Negri openly criticize the dominant schemas used to understand historical and political change, that of a historical telos or the dialectic of inside and outside, the proletariat as a class that is in civil society but not of civil society. In place of these time-worn schemas, Hardt and Negri have suggested Empire as a diffuse social order, and the multitude as that resistant subjectivity that is coextensive with it. In Negri’s words, “Empire is directly confronted by the multitude, and the multitude by Empire.”1 Understanding this relationship, of a global order without outside or center and a resistant subjectivity that is coextensive with it, has open up Hardt and Negri to much criticism: the first term, empire, has been dismissed as hopelessly inaccurate given global inequalities and, more importantly, the later term, multitude, has been dismissed as hopelessly optimistic.

For Casarino the common is the specific difference between Empire and the Multitude. However, as much as the common makes it possible to draw this line, it does so ambiguously: the common is both the condition for capital, constituting its basis, and the material grounds of revolt. No rigorous dividing line can be drawn between the common as presuppositon of capital and the common as radical contestation. They are not two different things, but different relations. As Casarino writes, “Revolutionary becoming is living the common as surplus” (22). There is a fundamental ambiguity to the common, which is in need of constant political differentiation (260). Casarino’s way to articulate this distinction focuses on the following sentence from Hardt and Negri’s Multitude: “the common appears at both ends of immaterial production, as presupposition and result.”2 As Casarino argues, the presupposition must be fundamentally different than the result. Casarino clarifies this by way of Dante and the example of language: the common as presupposed is virtual, a kind of potentiality that is actualized in specific formations, just as language is a generic capacity that is actualized in specific languages. The common as presupposition is nothing outside of its effects, just as one never encounters language as such but always specific languages, but this is different from being nothing. Casarino’s introduction of the virtual makes it possible to understand the contemporary political order: capitalism would make the common into a nothing, rather than nothing outside of its effects, denying any basis of collectivity whatsoever.

Casarino’s focus on the reduction of the common to nothing underscores a crucial aspect of contemporary politics: neoliberalism as an economic and political order predicated on the reduction of society to that which can be privately possessed. It also casts a different light on Hardt and Negri’s concepts. In Multitude they distinguish between the multitude sub specie aeternitatis and political multitude: the first refers to the generic capacities of human existence, reason and desire, that are at the basis of social existence, while the second refers to the specific political project of articulating a multitude based on the current prospects of collective existence. Casarino’s formulation adds to this distinction, a distinction that is initially awkwardly framed between an eternal reality and a political project, or essence and existence, the distinction between virtual and actual, drawn from Deleuze. The two multitudes, or the two commons, are not simply related as essence and appearance, but as the immanent cause and its actualization. Finally, Casarino’s example of language as this relation between the virtual and actual, an example that is repeated numerous times throughout the discussions with Negri, underscores that as a philosophical problem the common focuses as much on the fundamental aspects of human subjectivity, on a philosophical anthropology, as it does on an ontology.

The turn towards philosophical anthropology, towards an examination of humanity through its fundamental activities and relations, differentiates Negri’s work from the work of thinkers of a previous generation such as Deleuze, Michel Foucault, and Louis Althusser. For Deleuze, and other “anti-humanist” thinkers, any discussion of human nature, of some commonality, was an effect of power or an ideological ruse. Negri’s and Casarino’s work has more in common (no pun intended) with the work of Giorgio Agamben, Etienne Balibar, and Paolo Virno, who have returned to the maligned field of philosophical anthropology, to a consideration of what makes us human, not as a generic essence, but as the interplay between abstract potential and singular differences. This is not to say that these conceptions are the same. In the interviews, and in the essay on the political monster, Negri distinguishes his understanding of humanity from Agamben’s understanding of bare, or naked, life. For Agamben, bare life, the reduction of humanity to pure survival, is at the basis of the modern state. Such an understanding of humanity disavows the common, specifically the way in which the common as presupposition constitutes a kind of historicity. As Negri writes,

There is no naked life in ontology, much as there is no social structure without rules, or word without meaning. The universal is concrete. What precedes us in time, in history, always already presents itself as an ontological condition, and, as far as man is concerned, as (consistent, qualified, irreversible) anthropological figure (208).

In contrast to this, Paolo Virno’s thought is much closer to Casarino’s and Negri’s, even to the point of using language as the paradigmatic instance of the common. However, Negri criticizes Virno for reducing language to a faculty, to a generic and timeless essence. The criticisms of Virno and Agamben, as much as they serve as valuable points of distinction, also serve to develop the conception of the common as it is understood by Negri and Casarino. What differentiates the common as developed by Negri (in his own works and in collaboration with Michael Hardt and in the interviews with Casarino) is that it is neither a universal condition, a kind of degree zero, as in Agamben’s concept of bare life, nor a transcendent faculty, as in Virno’s writing. These different criticisms are the product of a singular idea: that of the common as simultaneously produced, the effect of different labors and actions, and productive, the condition of different labors and actions.

While Negri’s criticism might apply to such early texts as Virno’s The Grammar of the Multitude, Virno’s later texts have attempted to engage with the intersection of the natural and the common. While a full defense of Virno’s position exceeds the confines of a book review, his later position is illuminating in precisely the way in which it explicitly thematizes the recent turn to a philosophical anthropology of the common. As Virno writes:

Human nature returns to the centre of attention not because we are finally dealing with biology rather than history, but because the biological prerogatives of the human animal have acquired undeniable historical relevance in the current productive process.3

The common, the basic and fundamental aspect of human relations, language, habits, etc., has become a pressing concern for politics and philosophy because it has become part of the current regime of production, which relies on information and knowledge as much as it does the force of the human body. Virno’s point is in accordance with Negri’s general understanding of a post-Fordist economy, but such remarks are largely absent from In Praise of the Common. The absence of the historical argument regarding modes of labor, which is central to Empire and Multitude, helps to underscore the philosophical dimension of the common. However, as the contrast with Virno illustrates, it avoids the intersection of history and philosophy, concept and condition that is the hallmark of materialist thought.

While the essays and interviews collected in the book leave out the historical dimension of the common with respect to the contemporary production process, primarily underscoring the complexity of the common as a philosophical problem, they obliquely address the history of the common in the search for a name for the politics of the common. Here the problems are no less daunting than they are with respect to ontology or anthropology. Discussing Multitude, Casarino indicates that the word communism is practically absent, appearing only twice, which is strange given the work Hardt and Negri put into redefining the term in Empire. This leads to a discussion of the possibility of wresting a name from its history, or rather affirming part of a history while casting off the various misappropriations. Casarino is specifically suspicious of Hardt and Negri’s shift towards democracy as the name of the politics of the common. As Casarino argues, “the term democracy has been often at least as baneful as, say, the tendentious and opportunistic socialist misappropriations of communism” (100); it has been founded upon limitation and exclusion, from the ancient Greek conception, which excluded women and slaves, to modern representative democracy which excludes everyone.

Here we see the central problem of the first essay repeated once again: the common name, the common word, is split between its unpresentable potential and its actual incarnation. Nevertheless the problem of the name adds a dimension to this relation, in that every name threatens to obscure as much as it enlightens, masking the common. The name is not just an actualization of the common, one language amongst many possible languages, but is also a limitation of it, obscuring its potential. Communism may be the proper name of the politics of the common, but it is burdened by a history that obscures its creative dimension, bringing the common under the sway of the state. On the other hand, democracy is equally burdened. It has repressed the common by subordinating it to the unity and representation of the people, and subjected it to exclusions that are seen as necessary antidotes to anarchy. These names of the common are not common names, they do not invoke the full force of the common, and they summon as many horrors as they do possibilities for liberation. This lack of a name, of a common name, is particularly troubling given current political projects to construct an image of human nature, and thus of society, that would function without the common, reducing everything to a politics based on the individual as self-possessed property holder. Of course it is possible to suggest that the common can become its own proper name; if so, why speak of communism, democracy and multitude at all?

Negri’s final essay on “The Political Monster” offers an oblique response to this question. For Negri the monster breaks with a eugenic conception of politics, a politics founded on the identity of origin and rule (both senses of arché). The monster is a figure of excess, of productivity that is constrained by neither origin nor order. As Negri argues, both capital and the working class have been considered in their own right to be monsters (198). The monster then is the idea of a singular that is not determined in advance by the common, an actualization that is not given in the virtual. The monster gives a figure to a central task of Negri’s thought over the last several decades: to think the productivity of being rather than its essence; to posit the modes as something other than the realization of substance, to use Spinoza’s terms; or, in political terms, to posit a constituent power that is not reducible to a constitution. The monster is the improper name of the common. Ultimately, the monster suggests that the task is not to find an adequate name for the common, a name that would match its essence, but to produce it from singular instances. In Praise of the Common is one such singular instance.

1 Antonio Negri, “Kairòs, Alma Venus, Multitudo,” in Time for Revolution. Translated by Matteo Mandarini. (New York: Continuum, 2003) pg. 229.

2 Michael Hardt and Antonio Negri, Multitude: War and Democracy in the Age of Empire. (New York: Penguin, 2004) pg. 148.

3 Paolo Virno, “Natural-Historical Diagrams: The ‘New Global’ Movement and the Biological Invariant,” translated by Alberto Toscano in The Italian Difference. Edited by Lorenzo Chiesa and Alberto Toscano. In The Italian Difference: Between Nihilism and Biopolitics. (Melbourne:, 2009) pg. 142.