In Pursuit of the Good: Intellect and Action in Aristotle's Ethics

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Eric Salem, In Pursuit of the Good: Intellect and Action in Aristotle's Ethics, Paul Dry Books, 2010, 194pp., $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781589880504.

Reviewed by Michael Pakaluk, Institute for the Psychological Sciences



Readers who jump from the beginning to the end of the Nicomachean Ethics (NE) — such as instructors and students in not a few introductory courses — have been perplexed by an apparent change in Aristotle’s view, from seeming to recommend all activity in accordance with virtue as happiness, in book I, to arguing that the actualization of one virtue alone, sophia, counts as happiness, in book X. It is hardly satisfactory to say that Aristotle contradicts himself on the main subject of his great treatise. Accordingly, scholars have attempted to resolve the contradiction, taking predictable paths: some holding to one side while trying to explain away evidences of the other (“intellectualism”, “inclusivism”); others claiming that each side is true, in a sense, because Aristotle uses the relevant terms in different senses, or addresses two audiences at once; and yet others attributing the disparity to a change, or “development”, of Aristotle’s view over time.

Eric Salem takes a different approach in his interpretive essay on NE, arguing in effect that this problem which has troubled scholars for so long is a problem of their own making, since it is an artifact of their neglecting to read NE properly. According to Salem, the material that falls between books I and X has a purpose: it is designed to take the reader, by persuasion and pedagogy, from an initial acceptance of the viewpoint of book I to a considered agreement with Aristotle on the viewpoint of book X. Omit the intervening books, then, and skip the instruction which Aristotle thereby aims to impart, and no wonder that the reader, disorientated and confused, is left with the impression that Aristotle has contradicted himself.

Salem confesses his debt to Leo Strauss and Harry Jaffa, favoring a “dynamic” reading of NE that brings out what he sees as “the dramatic or dialectical character” of the work.1 Of course every lengthy argument is “dynamic”, in the sense that reasonable persons who carefully follow its steps will typically change their own view along the way, and typically only someone who has arrived at an intermediate conclusion is well-positioned to appreciate how a more ultimate conclusion follows. But Salem seems to mean by a “dynamic” reading three things more: first, it takes the structure of the work to be as significant as its content (hence it conceives of the work as “dramatic”); second, it supposes that the reader is meant to be changed by the work progressively, not simply in what he asserts but also in what he values and wants; third, it keeps alert to the possibility that the author, in order to bring the reader along in this way, will argue ad hominem, saying what he believes his reader will agree to, even if this requires hiding or concealing his own view (hence it is “dialectical”). These devices are controversial, as Straussianism is, because they all suppose some kind of non-rational influence: “structure” affects us implicitly and, as it were, unconsciously; our values and wants seem to be affected more by rhetoric than argument; and “concealment” seems not to exclude manipulation. As a safeguard we might wish to adopt as a rule of thumb for a philosopher that such devices ought to be used only in the service of, but not as replacing, reasoning and argument; the corresponding rule for an interpreter would be that attention to such devices would generally be sound only insofar as it serves to highlight a philosopher’s reasoning but misguided when it takes the place of examining that reasoning. So a pertinent concern as regards Salem’s interpretation is whether his attention to the supposed “dynamic” character of NE keeps to a proper place.

According to Salem, NE is written for leaders active in public life (“cultivated and active” men, hoi charietes kai praktikoi, 1095b22) who strive to attain honor. Such men can be brought fairly easily to agree at the beginning of the work, as in I.5-7, that happiness is not to be found in bodily pleasures or money but rather in “activity of life in accordance with virtue”. Yet Aristotle tellingly gets them to agree additionally that “if the virtues are several” then happiness will be activity “in accordance with the best and most complete [virtue]” (1098a17-18). This condition, Salem thinks, then explains the material of books II-IX, as Aristotle proceeds next to examine successively the candidates that his audience would likely propose for “best and most complete virtue”: magnanimity, justice, practical wisdom (phronēsis) and wisdom (sophia). On Salem’s view, each of these except the last, when examined, is shown by Aristotle to be incomplete in some significant way; thus the claim of book X, when finally reached, appears a natural and unsurprising conclusion, not something startlingly different and contradictory. Salem’s book gives a walk through NE, attempting to show that it follows such a framework, concluding with a rather drawn out discussion, stimulated by X.9, of why someone devoted to contemplative activity (theōria) will nonetheless care about legislation.

How convincing is Salem’s interpretation? He might wish to say that its soundness can truly be tested only by reading the complete NE in the manner he recommends, and seeing whether the work then has the effect which Salem says it should have. Reading the complete NE is to be recommended in any case, but one might raise doubts about Salem’s approach.

First of all, it is hardly plausible that NE is directed at “cultivated and active” men rather than, say, philosophers and theoreticians in a school (Aristotle’s or Plato’s), who aim to equip themselves with an understanding necessary for sound legislation or for advising legislators. For example, Aristotle’s minute refutation of the Platonic theory of the good in I.6 could not possibly have been directed at ordinary active men in Athens, as it presumes a familiarity with both Platonic metaphysics and the categories; in I.13, 1102a27 Aristotle says he will make use temporarily of considerations found in his “exoteric” writings, which implies that his discussion there is not exoteric; throughout NE, a familiarity with presocratic natural philosophers and members of the Academy is presupposed; again, VII.1 takes for granted an acquaintance with Aristotle’s philosophical method; and so on.

Salem argues for his view by claiming that it accounts for two features of the text.2 The first involves Aristotle’s apparent definition of happiness given at the end of the Function Argument: “the human good turns out to be activity of the soul in accordance with virtue” (1098a16-17). Salem notes that, in the argument leading up to that definition, Aristotle had placed great emphasis on the human soul’s reasonability, or its ability to grasp a logos: the function of a thing is found in what is distinctive of it; human beings are distinctive in having an aspect or part of the soul which grasps reasons; hence, the human function is “activity of the soul, and actions, that involve reason” (1098a13-14). And yet Aristotle’s definition of happiness fails to mention thinking or logos at all. Why? According to Salem, the wording of the definition shows that Aristotle was aiming to persuade “cultivated and active” men:

men for whom the good life consists in seeking honor through noble actions, reason would at most seem to be a needed instrument rather than a defining feature of happiness. To say or even to imply, as the qualifying phrases that Aristotle omits might, that happiness is to be found primarily in thinking … would run counter to human life as they understand it: it would needlessly offend the sense and sensibilities of his closest allies. Hence, I suggest, Aristotle’s omission of reason from the final form of his definition (p. 29).

Salem claims that Aristotle is subtly concealing his true purposes in giving the definition as he does:

By leaving reason out of the final form of his definition, Aristotle pushes this possibility [that is, that theoria constitutes happiness] to one side, displaces or even conceals it, so that the reader of his definition will be inclined to assume that happiness lies in a life of virtuous action (p. 32).

Yet it is incredible that astute “men of action” (think of the likes of Nicias, or Xenophon) could be hoodwinked in this way, or that Aristotle thought he could do so. Why should someone latch onto the definition, and not attend to what Aristotle had openly said three lines earlier, to justify that definition? A reader would have had the text right before him, both the definition and what came three lines earlier; for a listener, the time between Aristotle’s conclusion that the human function involves logos, and his stating the definition of happiness, would have amounted to about four seconds. No, a simpler and better explanation is that by “activity of the soul” Aristotle means, and intends his listener to understand, “activity which involves reason” — and not nutritive or merely perceptual activity — as he had said immediately beforehand.

Again, Salem claims that his hypothesis accounts for the virtues that Aristotle considers:

the dispositions of soul that Aristotle discusses in Books III through V seem to be precisely the ones that “the cultivated and active” would be inclined to recognize as virtues. Most issue in some form of action. And at least four of them — courage, magnanimity, the unnamed virtue which follows magnanimity, and justice — have something to do with honor, the primary concern of political men … Those books presuppose familiarity with the language of virtue and vice, and that language is in the first instance the language of “the cultivated and active” (p. 51).

But Aristotle discusses thirteen virtues in books II-V. Only two of these “deal with” honor: courage, rather, deals with fearful threats to bodily integrity, and justice deals with goods of fortune generally.3 It means little to say that a virtue “has something to do with honor”, because in Aristotle’s view every virtue deserves honor as a kind of reward (1163b4). Moderation, wittiness, and generosity hardly seem like virtues that only “the cultivated and active” would be likely to value or recognize. Magnificence on the other hand looks as if it might be that sort of thing, but Salem leaves it off his short list, presumably because it actually has little to do with honor.

In short, Salem wishes to argue, in effect, that his central hypothesis, that NE is at first directed at “the cultivated and active” men mentioned in I.5, is the best explanation for two features of the text. And yet his hypothesis fails actually to explain that evidence, and neither does Salem take pains to show that it is the best hypothesis among others which naturally suggest themselves as regards that evidence or which have been proposed by other scholars.

Similar criticisms may be raised against Salem’s view that NE III-IX is concerned with examining various contenders for “most complete” virtue. Salem thinks that Aristotle examines magnanimity, justice, phronēsis, and theōria in this spirit.4 But then why does Aristotle examine nine other virtues as well, some of which (liberality, wittiness) could not possibly have been regarded as serious candidates for the fullness of all virtue? He might claim that only in examining all contenders for virtue could Aristotle identify the contenders for the “most complete” virtue, and yet, if that were Aristotle’s purpose, one would expect that his remarks about individual virtues would always turn on, or conclude with, considerations as to that virtue’s “completeness”, which is clearly not the case.

That is, the text does not have the form one would expect it to have if it were written with the purposes that Salem ascribes to Aristotle. Thus Salem has to invent arguments which are not in the text. For instance, according to Salem, what Aristotle is attempting to convey about magnanimity is that that virtue makes someone hold back from actions:

can Aristotle be satisfied, and can we be satisfied, by a “complete” virtue with so limited an energeia — an energeia a-ergos, as it were? To give the question a more general form: If magnanimity does not lead directly to the practice of the other virtues for their own sake and does not itself have a persuasively complete activity associated with it, can it be the complete virtue Aristotle is looking for? (p. 70)

This is an interesting objection to magnanimity, but there seem to be no grounds for attributing it to Aristotle.

The shortcomings of Salem’s book seem related to its manner and method. As to its manner, Salem, as mentioned, offers an interpretive essay, not a “paper” or series of “papers” presented as contributing in some quasi-scientific way to a putatively enduring project of scholarship. Well and good: scientific papers are probably not the best model for philosophical thought. But an upshot — not a necessary upshot, but one that affects this case — is that he does not take the most basic care to support his interpretation by defending it in relation to reasonable alternatives.5

As to its method, Salem, as we have seen, favors interpreting NE as a “dynamic” text, in the way explained. This approach clearly leads him astray at times, as when he most implausibly attributes to Aristotle’s definition of happiness an intent to “hide” and “conceal”. But a far more serious objection is that Salem, for all his professions of wanting “to grapple directly with Aristotle’s thought” (p. 6) and “to understand Aristotle as he understands himself” (p. 9), gives no illuminating accounts of any distinctions, classifications, lines of reasoning or arguments in NE — although one wouldn’t doubt his ability to discuss the text in this way. The reason, it seems, is that an interpreter looking for a “dynamic” reading becomes interested primarily in a hypothesized effect of the text on a hypothetical audience: what becomes important about a philosopher’s assertion, then, is that he has asserted it, not the philosophical reasons for his assertion, and whether these reasons are compelling.

Oddly, this method which claims an especial subtlety in grappling directly with Aristotle’s thought seems to offer the temptation to treat him as no more than an authority.

1 177-8n20. See Harry V. Jaffa, Thomism and Aristotelianism: A Study of the Commentary by Thomas Aquinas on the Nicomachean Ethics, Westport, CT.: Greenwood Press, 1979.

2 Salem does not, as one might expect, rely on Richard Bodéüs’ arguments in The Political Dimensions of Aristotle’s Ethics, Albany, NY: SUNY Press, 1993.

3 Aristotle differentiates virtues according to what they “deal with” (what they are “about” or “concerned with”, Greek peri).

4 It seems a mistake, even on his own terms, for Salem to have included justice on this list: the particular virtue of justice hardly looks to be complete, and “whole justice” is neither justice in the strict sense nor a single virtue, according to Aristotle in V.1.

5 There is no evidence in the book that Salem has consulted scholarship on Aristotle’s Ethics post 1996.