In Search of Mechanisms: Discoveries across the Life Sciences

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Carl F. Craver and Lindley Darden, In Search of Mechanisms: Discoveries across the Life Sciences, University of Chicago Press, 2013, 228pp., $25.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780226039794.

Reviewed by Stuart A. Newman, New York Medical College


This is a highly readable and disciplinarily diverse compendium of the varieties of mechanisms encountered in biological systems and the means by which they are studied. For this reason, and the fact that much of the substantial earlier material on this subject was written by the two authors, Carl Craver and Lindley Darden, individually and jointly, it is likely to be the classic reference in this area for many years. The new work represents an advance over previous treatments in its logical organization and coverage. It also develops in greater depth some problem agendas discussed before, such as discovery strategies and inter-level integration of mechanisms. The examples provided, ranging from molecular-level phenomena such as the mediation between genes and proteins by messenger RNA and the basis and prospective treatments of cystic fibrosis, to organism-level processes such as the circulation of the blood and the ecological-scale phenomenon of eutrophication of estuary zones, are masterfully described, with just the right balance of detail to communicate important points to readers with modest or sophisticated understandings of general biology.

Reading this book, though, leaves me wondering whether mechanisms are among the distinctive or even most significant features of life-forms. Every material system embodies mechanisms of some sort. Although the authors make an effort early on to establish that biological mechanisms are not the same thing as machines, their working definition ("entities and activities organized such that they are productive of regular changes from start or set-up to finish or termination conditions" (15)) seems to situate their subject in the world of devices, and indeed the book often reads more like an engineering (or reverse-engineering) manual than a treatise on biology. But (as they note), machines are designed, and the arrangement and interactions of their components are unambiguously in the service of known functions. The philosophically interesting question of how or whether functions in biological systems are like those of machines is not explored in any detail.

Earthquakes and hurricanes can also be said to have mechanisms, in the sense that components and parts of the developing phenomena influence other components and parts. But they also have self-organizational aspects -- collective expressions of their material properties -- that elude a strictly mechanistic description. They also lack purposes. How are living things like and unlike these and other complex products of nature? More particularly, what is the relation between the mechanisms in organisms to the unique characteristics of the living state? In Search of Mechanisms, despite its many virtues, does not address such questions. It therefore misses an opportunity to describe the limitations of viewing life through the lens of mechanism.

Works of art also embody mechanisms: the bearings on a kinetic sculpture by Anthony Caro enable its parts to move in the wind; the ghost is Shakespeare's (and the play's) mechanism for making Hamlet's private suspicions overt. Few would claim, however, that the essence or meaning of these works would be captured by enumerating such mechanisms. A recent film, Tim's Vermeer, a case in point, documents an engineer's search for the optical mechanism by which the seventeenth century painter plausibly achieved his eerily realistic portrayals of figures and objects and the fall of light. The film's protagonist indeed recreates, almost indistinguishably, one of the artist's paintings, leaving the viewer nonetheless still in awe at the genius of the work's conception and composition. The describable mechanisms by which it was produced provide no help in this regard.

Organisms, being unplanned products of material processes, might be thereby thought to be ontologically closer to things like hurricanes than to paintings or even machines. But living beings, unlike storms and other nonliving dynamical phenomena self-regulate and reproduce according to implicit purposes. This led Kant to consider organisms along with artworks (if only by contrast), in his analysis of teleological judgment. And since (as he concluded) the principles by which an apparently purposive entity is organized cannot be reduced to the mechanisms by which it operates, it seems relevant for a philosophical inquiry into biological mechanisms to explore the connection between function and purpose. But Kant's third Critique is not mentioned in the book, and Aristotle's schema of causes barely so. The focus is all on efficient and material causes, with formal and final causes side-stepped. In a sense this is understandable; few scientific thinkers relish grappling with the bête-noire of design. But this distancing does not make the issue of purposiveness go away.

The common recourse is to push conceptually the organism's required plan into the cell nucleus, in the form of a supposed genetic program for each species opportunistically arrived at through natural selection. Though the authors explicitly abjure a strict genetic determinism in their discussion of multi-level causation, neither do they problematize the standard evolutionary narrative apart from acknowledging (as "beyond the scope of our discussion here") that "scientists still debate whether additional mechanisms are necessary to explain the origin of higher level taxa such as genera, families, orders, and kingdoms" (182). This caveat (a large one, since it pertains to major defining characteristics of all organisms) frees them to discuss the multifarious mechanical, chemical, electrical, organism-organism and organism-environment interactions involved in what a biological system does, with little or no interrogation of how it came to do those things. But this is inadequate, not least because (as the authors note) natural selection is not clearly a mechanism in the senses they discuss, and (as I will argue below) the evolutionary processes by which organisms are constituted are not encapsulated by gradualist natural selection.

One problem is the ambiguous notion of function in living systems. As the authors state,

The heart makes glub-blub noises and generates heat. But these are not relevant to the circulation of blood, even if they may be relevant to other containing mechanisms in which we might be interested. . . . The generation of heat by the movements of the heart plays a limited functional role in the different higher-level mechanism of thermoregulation. Which higher level mechanism is relevant depends on the context in which the mechanism is being discussed and the chosen phenomenon of interest. That is, it depends on the higher-level perspective from which one views the components functional role (23-24).

And later,

Characterizing the phenomena to be explained is a vital step in the discovery of mechanisms. . . . Not all phenomena are evolutionarily advantageous. That is, not all phenomena are proper functions of some part of the organism. . . . Not all of the phenomena for which biologists seek mechanisms are effects that have been selected for their contributions to fitness during evolutionary changes (53, 54).

This is certainly correct; but then, is there a privileged set of phenomena, and mechanisms, that are essential to the living state, or to the organism in question? The authors' notion of "proper function" of a part (and presumably, a process) is defined as "the role the part played in the evolutionary history of the organisms that have it." But this is much too off-hand. As Marta Linde-Medina (Journal of Biosciences 36 (2011): 575-585) has noted in relation to morphological evolution, the role of a feature or character when it first arises may bear little relation to its role in a present-day descendent, and the entire armamentarium of the Modern Synthesis devoted to fending off this problem -- pre-adaptation, exaptation, "spandrels" -- is inadequate to account for the feature's existence in the absence of a theory of form.

More generally (staying with morphological evolution for the moment), the phenomenon of "developmental system drift" (True JR, Haag ES, Evolution & Development 3 (2001): 109-119) plays havoc with conventional ideas about mechanism, at least as understood in the framework adopted in the book. In more than 20 species of nematode worms of the genus Caenorhabditis, for example, despite an invariant anatomy and the cell lineages that generate it, orthologous genes have evolved to take on qualitatively different roles and expression patterns in early embryonic pattering, sex determination, and organs of the reproductive and excretory systems, among others (Verster AJ, Ramani AK, McKay SJ, Fraser AG, PLOS Genetics 10 (2014): e1004077). In the well-known case of insect segmentation, to take another example, different species utilize distinct mechanisms, which generate segments simultaneously or sequentially, or a mixture of both, using some of the same and some different genes, with little overt difference in the outcomes (Salazar-Ciudad I, Solé, R, Newman SA, Evolution & Development 3 (2001): 95-103). It is not that detailed mechanisms cannot be identified for these developmental processes, but that their details seem less important than the higher-level morphological "attractors" that exert a kind of downward causation (a concept not mentioned in the book) on their permissible variation, which is rather prolific.

At the other end of the compositional hierarchy is the biochemical phenotype, comprising the basic parts that make up all living systems and their reactions. It is notable that even such fundamental units as proteins have context-dependent identities. Identical proteins with different conformations are used in many species as both enzymes of intermediary metabolism and crystallins of the transparent structural material of the eye's cornea, in a phenomenon known as "gene-sharing" (Piatigorsky J, Integrative and Comparative Biology 43 (2003): 492-9). Indeed, more than 30% of the proteins of eukaryotic cells are now characterized (based on new analytical techniques) as "intrinsically disordered" (Gsponer J, Babu MM, Progress in Biophysics and Molecular Biology 99 (2009): 94-103), meaning that both their structures and functions can vary among cell types and change over the course of evolution. Again, the processes in which these molecules participate can no doubt be characterized as mechanisms, but the degree to which the parts (and corresponding functions) are "proper" to the organism in question, an important issue for the authors' framework, is as fluid as proteins' identities.

To summarize, this is a needed work on a critical biological subject, and it is implemented in a wide-ranging and accessible fashion. But the uniqueness of living systems as complex, self-organizing and -activating materials, refined by, but not entirely products of, their evolutionary histories, eludes the mechanistic framework of this book. It remains for future works in the philosophy of biology to complement this very strong effort.