In the Light of Experience: New Essays on Perception and Reasons

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Johan Gersel, Rasmus Thybo Jensen, Morten S. Thaning, and Søren Overgaard (eds.), In the Light of Experience: New Essays on Perception and Reasons, Oxford University Press, 2018, 284pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198809630.

Reviewed by Thomas C. Vinci, Dalhousie University



While this article was in preparation, Gary Gutting, my editor at the Review, passed away. I dedicate this article to his memory.

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This collection originated in a workshop in Copenhagan, 2013. The articles are written by leading people in the field and meet a high scholarly standard, sophisticated in argument and well informed by the recent literature in internalist analytic epistemology. I am glad to see that reports of the death of this genre have been greatly exaggerated. Many of the articles have a polemical thrust, which makes them an exciting read. Often, the reader is met at the front door and taken by the hand through the argument, although one occasionally gets the feeling of having arrived in the middle of a long conversation, one's arrival having been not especially well noted. This has been mitigated by an excellent exposition of each article by Johan Gersel and Rasmus Thybo Jensen. Some of the articles are overlong (approaching 20,000 words) and the type is small and hard to read. But, overall, a great job by all concerned.

In "Travis on Frege, Kant, and the Given: Comments on 'Unlocking the Outer World'", John McDowell continues a polemic which Charles Travis carried out in previous papers -- the exchange is nicely summarized in Gersel's introduction -- on the best way to explain how the experience of objects in the empirical world constitutes reasons for beliefs about those objects. He calls the latter "Minimal Empiricism". McDowell's engagement is largely by proxy, through a discussion of Kant and Frege. McDowell accepts Kant's distinction between intuition and judgment, along with Kant's "slogan" that the same function -- conceptual activity -- that unifies intuitions also acts to unify judgments. McDowell argues by Transcendental Argument from Minimal Empiricism: only if empirical intuition and judgment were unities constituted by the same function would it be possible for objects given in intuition to themselves provide reasons for judgments. Otherwise there would be a "gap." Trying to bridge this gap non-conceptually is what McDowell calls the Myth of the Given. The differences between intuitions and judgments allow for consistency with Minimal Empiricism.

Through a discussion of Frege, McDowell attributes to Travis the view that reasons come from a perception of non-concept-dependent "fact-like things". McDowell ends his article with a poke at Travis:

The only things we need to countenance in the world are objects, which are worldly in one good sense, and facts . . . which . . . are worldly in another. . . . The fact-like but non-conceptual items Travis invents under labels like 'Sid's being as he is', are mythical. (35)

In "The Move, the Divide, the Myth, and its Dogma", Travis lays out an account of his perceptual epistemology and responds to McDowell's complaint about mythical entities.

Travis and McDowell agree that the sense-perception of things in the outer world provides reasons for believing propositions to be true and that we do not perceive propositions. Perceiving-that p is judging-that p on the basis of what we see non-propositionally. So, there is a transition ("The Move") that has to occur between something that is not a proposition and something that is, and the former must entail the latter. Both agree that in judgment there is an element of generality that is contributed by concepts. So there is a "divide" between what counts as a perceptual reason, and the proposition (or judgment) which it warrants. So far McDowell and Travis are in agreement. The disagreement concerns whether some element of generality is a common constituent of both perceptual object and warranted proposition. McDowell insists that conceptual generality is an element of the representation of the object and of the judgment, whereas Travis denies that the object is general in any sense: it is a particular.

If I am seeing Sid eating peanuts (Travis' example), then the occurrence of the object of the seeing-event, Sid's eating peanuts, entails the proposition, Sid is eating peanuts. The former provides warrant for the judgment that the latter is true. The problem between Travis and McDowell concerns the status of events as proper objects of seeing. McDowell allows that I can see Sid and that I can come to judge on that basis that Sid is eating peanuts, but there is no such thing as the event, Sid's eating peanuts, understood as a particular thing without some inherent element of generality. (Thinking otherwise is the Myth of the Given.)

Critical engagement. For Travis, perceptual objects are events referred to by nominalizations like "Sid's eating peanuts." Ordinary language is on Travis's side here, at least in some cases. But not all. It is perfectly good English to say "I see a guitar and I also see its shape." Shape is a universal: it is not an event and the term "shape" is a name, not a nominalization. How would The Move work in this case? Here's a suggestion from Descartes: "If we perceive the presence of some attribute, we can infer that there must also be present an existing thing or substance to which it may be attributed". (Principles I, 52)[1] Now take a different example: "I see a guitar and I also see its being that shape." The term "being that shape" is a nominalization -- the type of referring term Travis employs for his perceptual objects -- yet this is not a natural formulation in ordinary English. To get one we need to paraphrase the sentence as "I see a guitar and see that it is that shape." But now we have what even Travis would understand as a propositional/conceptual thought. This class of cases behaves as McDowell says they should: nominalization-forms collapse into conceptual forms, either intuitional or propositional. (I depart from McDowell and say that they collapse only into the latter.) The moral? If Travis wants to avoid McDowellian myths, he should look more favorably on perceiving the presence of universals rather than events as the proper objects of perception. But to do that, he would have to abandon his claim that the objects of vision are thoroughly non-general.

In "What is the Myth of the Given?", Gersel has two main objectives: (1) explaining what McDowell means by the Myth of the Given, and (2) having another go at reconstructing McDowell's argument that perceptual objects are unified by conceptual means. The reconstruction relies on positing a 4-level hierarchy of reasons.

The reconstruction is called "The Argument for Conceptualism", the conclusion of which is: "Generalities are given in experience." The key premise is (3): "Reasons3 cannot be given in experience unless generalities are given in experience." Building on Hannah Ginsborg's account of reasons1 and reasons2, Gersel says, "reasons1 acquire their status as reasons3 when they are given to the subject in such a way that he has the capacity to respond to them due to an appreciation of their status as reasons1." (83, my emphasis)

"The capacity to respond" depends on having a conceptual grasp of the reason, an experienced particular thing (83), which depends on "the subject in some way ascertain[ing] what generalities the particular given to him in experience falls under" (94), which itself depends on the conceptual subsumption of the object. (85-86) Finally, doing this requires that the object possesses an element of inherent generality. For present purposes, this is a conceptual structure. (Might there be some inadvertent slippage here from a role for concepts in the knowing of objects to a role for concepts in the constitution of objects?)

In "Empiricism and Normative Constraint", Ginsborg aims three main criticisms at McDowell's epistemology, and offers two corrective accounts.

The first criticism is of McDowell's alternative to the Davidsonian idea that only beliefs can be justifiers of other beliefs -- McDowell insists that such answers are epistemically impotent -- perceptual objects themselves fill this role. Ginsborg discusses various arguments for this that McDowell has previously offered, finding them inadequate. She proposes her own (the first positive account) maintaining that a subject's citing facts, whether perceptual or otherwise, is an appropriate first-person reason (reason1) offered to a demand for justification from a third party; but when a third party assesses the appropriateness of a reason1, then it is the subject's beliefs that are being assessed. If the assessment is positive, the subject has a reason2. (109 ff) The second criticism is that McDowell does not adequately explain how perceptual experiences act as proposition-justifiers. (118) The third is that McDowell does not see an external-to-thought role for sensations, and thus lacks an effective account of empirical-concept acquisition. (122-23) Her second positive account is that, while sensory patterns create specific verbal response patterns, there is, in the case of humans only, a special intelligent capacity which is the recognition of the appropriateness of certain responses. (124 ff.) (A problem? We need appropriateness-concepts to make appropriateness-judgments. How do we acquire the former?)

Christopher Gauker's "Do Perceptions Justify Beliefs? The Argument from 'Looks' Talk" initially discusses preliminary arguments for the negative answer to the titular question. Gauker's main project, however, is to critique a plausible-looking argument of his own devising, The Meta-Argument from 'Looks' Talk. The Meta-Argument depends on another argument, the Basic 'Looks' Argument. Its one premise is "a looks F", its one conclusion is "a is F". The nerve of the Meta-Argument is that for every case of an F-looking-state there is a possible same-content perception that is "reported by" the former. (152) So, if an F-looking-state is a justifier -- to be established by the Basic 'Looks' Argument -- there is a perception which is a justifier. QED.

Gauker next turns to the task of rebutting the Basic Argument, by considering five possible defenses, also of his own devising, finding each to fail. The fourth defense, that the probability that a is F given that a appears F is greater than that of the former by itself, is the most significant of those on offer. The rebuttal-claim is:

If, as I suggested, . . . that a visually appears F is true only if the proposition that a is F is the content of someone's visual perception (but not identical to the proposition that someone visually perceives that a is F) then, it would seem, the only probability that could attach to the proposition that a visually appears F would be the probability of the proposition that a is F. (156)

In this case, of course, the probability that a is F, given that a appears F, = 1, "which proves too much." (156) QED. (A parting question: Why wouldn't the probability of the proposition that a appears F be determined on the content of the proposition that a appears F itself?)

In "Fallibility for Infallibilists", Jason Leddington aims to save McDowell's infallibilism. Infallibilism says that perceptual reasons entail the truth of the belief that arises from them. So, if a red tomato is visually present to me, that is logically conclusive grounds for thinking that it is red. Of course, sometimes, because our capacities are "imperfect", the procedures we follow in their exercise have been defectively carried out. However, when the procedures have been carried out correctly, no mistake can occur. "I [McDowell] want to say that if an excellent putter . . . misses a putt, then there must have been something off [in his routine]"[2]. Leddington objects: "I agree that something must have been off, but I deny that it must be in the exercise of the capacity." What is "off" is the fact that the capacity over time does not yield 100% success, just enough to count as a capacity. This is the "success-rate" model of capacities. Now Leddington takes a crucial step: "on McDowell's view, our perceptual capacities are imperfect, so [they are] success-rate capacities." (170) Leddington offers no argument for this contention that I can detect here[3] other than the fact that he himself favours the success-rate model. In any case, Leddington goes on to argue that if imperfect capacities are thus understood, McDowell cannot preserve the idea that when things go right, perceptual evidence is infallibile. In the final section, Leddington makes a suggestion about how this can be fixed, distinguishing between actual knowledge-generating practices and those that just seem that way.

In "Perception and the Vagaries of Experience", Alan Millar gives an exceptionally clear account of a dispute between a version of perceptual relationalism and a non-relational view of experience. Obviously, Millar says, the things we see and hear are external. If we add to this Direct Realism, we get the kind of relationalism that Millar is interested in. Its problem is to account for non-veridical experience. On a standard version of the non-relationalist view, both kinds of experience contain a common state, thus, what we see is not a physical object. But this is inconsistent with Direct Realism, which Millar accepts. Millar also chronicles problems for how the standard view can account for perceptual-demonstrative thought and for empiricism about external-object beliefs.

His positive project is to explain and defend a new version of non-relationalism that avoids these problems. Inspired by Strawson, Millar proposes that an hallucination of a sunset be described "by such locutions as, 'It looks to me just as if the sun is setting over the ocean' or 'It's just as if I see the sun setting over the ocean'". (193) He defends this idea against the unacceptable consequences, (1) that the experiences themselves are the objects of perception and (2) that there is a common intrinsic property recognized by the speaker.

(But there is a difficulty. Suppose we are Sellarsians and endorse the second locution. Either it expresses a true judgment or it does not. If it does not, Millar's project fails. If it does, then there is an analogy between the two situations recognized by the subject. This, in turn, requires recognition on the subject's part of an intrinsic property common to both situations. But then Millar's project also fails.)

When two things are "subjectively indistinguishable," the Cartesian view is that their knowledge-grounding status and their phenomenal character are also indistinguishable. Many have denied the former (the denial is "epistemic disjunctivism"), but Logue, radically, also denies the latter ("phenomenal disjunctivism").

In her exceptionally clear, "World in Mind: Extending Phenomenal Character and Resisting Skepticism", Heather Logue characterizes phenomenal character as the "characteristic feel" that something's looking yellow has. (215) In cases of veridical experience "the phenomenal character consists in perceiving mind-independent entities." (215) Logue does not explain why she thinks this. Perhaps, like Sellars, she regards perception-concepts (seeing, hearing, etc.) as conceptually prior to looks-concepts? This would mean that we have to explain the way things look in terms of perceiving things in the environment -- the "Extended View" of phenomenal character. Since in hallucinations we do not perceive anything Logue seems to conclude, after discussing some complications, that hallucinations lack phenomenal character. (218-220)

When perceptions are epistemic grounds for belief, they are logically conclusive epistemic-grounds. (224) This is not the case with any non-veridical experiences. (225) This is her version of epistemic disjunctivism.

Critical engagement. For Logue, to say that hallucinations lack phenomenal character is just to say that they are not perceptions, and they are not perceptions because the requisite objects do not exist. But hallucinations exist; and they are experiences. So, what are experiences? Understood as a term in ordinary language, on one view, the term "experience" simply collects perception or sensations verbs; it does not designate an independent concept. When I have had a certain experience this means only that I saw something, or felt something, etc. On another view, the term does designate an independent concept. The second view, I believe, is a myth (the "Myth of Experience" as we might call it), thus we are left with the first. Consequently, because they are experiences, hallucinations have to be characterized in perception-terms. If the only things we can see are objects, then hallucinations are impossible; but hallucinations are not impossible, so we must be able see something other than objects. Colours and shapes would do nicely.

In " Objects and the Explanation of Perception," Bill Brewer engages in two intertwined projects, one in philosophy of mind, the other in metaphysics. Both start from the imperative to distinguish what depends on our minds from what is in the world independently of our minds.

The first question is: What theories of perception are needed to satisfy this imperative? Answer: "We [need to] think of our perceptual experience as the joint upshot of what there is in the world around us and our changing point of view upon it as we move through the world." (239) Brewer contrasts the joint-upshot account with one in which perception is "a simple unstructured presence of its direct objects." (240) From Locke and Berkeley he gets it that the unstructured-presence theory entails that "the unperceived existence of those very objects is unintelligible", (239) hence that any version of this theory violates the imperative. (Not so. A version in which there is an essential attribute of non-mental things and a perceptual faculty whose direct objects present to the mind just such an attribute does not. Such a version is to be found in Descartes: the faculty in question is the Imagination, the attribute in question is extension and the direct objects are figures in the brain.[4])

The second question is: What kinds of objects are needed? Brewer adopts a metaphysical approach in which object-kinds are differentiated by whether or not they have the property of exclusively occupying a certain spatio-temporal path. The former are "Natural Continuants" and they alone fulfill the imperative. (237)

There has been renewed interest in the idea that there is a special relationship between things and true propositions -- truth-making -- different from, and more metaphysically interesting than, the definition of the word "truth". Mark Kalderon takes up this idea, proposing that

the yellowish red warrants judging that the tomato is red because the former makes the latter true . . . Of course [the colour] must be cognitively accessible . . . that is what perception does.[5]

The yellowish-red is the truthmaker for "The tomato is red", it is the object of our perception, and, on this view (The Truth Maker View, TMV), it is the reason warranting the belief. This view is J.J. Cunningham's target in "Are Perceptual Reasons the Objects of Perception?"

Cunningham touts TMV (257-67) as a solution to an inconsistency-puzzle arising from four principles: Reasons Priority, the Doxastic Thesis, Belief Independence and the Non-Inferential Thesis. The two most important are the Doxastic Thesis -- all reasons for belief are themselves beliefs -- and Reasons Priority: "perceptual knowledge that p consists in believing that p on the basis of a reason . . . which has been provided by one's perceptual experience." (257) The right solution, says Cunningham, requires accepting Reasons Priority and rejecting the Doxastic Thesis. This is just what TMV does.

Cunningham's case against TMV is The Explanatory Exclusion Argument:

(P1) If S believes that p for the reason that R then S's belief that p is subject to a rationalizing explanation which has R as its explanans.

(P2) The explanantia of rationalizing explanations are truths.

(C) If S believes that p for the reason that R then R is a truth. (267)

Reasons are truths, truths are not truth-makers, so reasons are not truthmakers. QED. As Gersel has pointed out in the introduction (12), the first premise amounts to saying that all of Ginsborg's reasons1 must also be reasons2. The second is plausible on its face. In the remainder of the article, Cunningham makes a case for each premise and defends them against two key objections. He also considers, and rejects, a revised version of TMV.


Kalderon, Mark Eli. 2011. "Before the Law" Philosophical Issues 21 (1): 219-43.

Vinci, Tom. 1998. Cartesian Truth (Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press)

Vinci, Tom. 2008. "Mind-Body Causation, Mind-body Union and the 'Special Mode of Thinking' in Descartes," British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 16(3) 2008: 461-488.

[1] Note that it is the presence of the attribute that is the object of perception. Reading "property," sensory as well as intellectual, for "attribute," I interpret this principle as the key premise in Descartes's infallibilist-foundationalist epistemology, which I develop in Vinci (1998), 13-19. Descartes’s special theory of judgment is what allows "the gap" to be bridged. Rather than a mental act taking a perceived particular (the reason) and subsuming it under a universal (the judgment) -- this is where the possibility of error comes in -- a Cartesian judgment starts with a perceived universal (the reason) and infers a necessary, propositional consequence (the judgment): that there is a thing that has the universal. (The thing can be myself.) The room for error in judgment now vanishes. (This requires a non-representationalist reading of Descartes’s Theory of Ideas.)

[2] In a personal email to Leddington, July 14, 2013. Quoted on p. 169.

[3] But see note 28, 175.

[4] See Vinci 2008.

[5] The passages are from Kalderon, 2011: 277; quoted on 266.