In the Self's Place: The Approach of St. Augustine

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Jean-Luc Marion, In the Self's Place: The Approach of St. Augustine, Jeffrey L. Kosky (tr.), Stanford University Press, 2012, 414pp., $25.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780804762915.

Reviewed by John D. Caputo, Syracuse University/Villanova University


It was almost inevitable that Jean-Luc Marion would write a book about Augustine. Marion is widely regarded as both the leading Catholic philosopher of his generation and the leading scholar of René Descartes, with whom Augustinian scholarship has been intermingled, even entangled, ever since the 17th century. In a book bearing the suggestive title In the Self's Place (Au lieu de soi), Marion reads the Confessions as an exercise in what he calls a "saturated phenomenology." Thinking in the wake of Heidegger's project of "overcoming metaphysics," Marion means to liberate the iconic God of love from the idol of the God of being. But, for Marion, Augustine does not actually need to "overcome" metaphysics because he comes before metaphysics. Unlike the subsequent history of philosophy and theology, and hence unlike his modern readers and translators, Augustine was never a party to metaphysics in the first place. Augustine is after metaphysics because he is before it (9).

This strategy, too, is adapted from Heidegger, who liked to say that in the great Greek beginning of philosophy what we find is "thinking," not metaphysics, ethics, and epistemology, which are schoolroom distinctions whose very emergence is an unmistakable sign of the decline of thinking. Just so, for Marion, the later categories of philosophy, theology, and even autobiography are nowhere to be found in Augustine. They have not been invented yet. When Augustine uses the word philosophy, he means the love of God (6-7). When he writes the Confessions he is not speaking of himself but of God, and so the book is not an autobiography but a heterobiography (43-45). And the self of whom he speaks is the very opposite of a Cartesian cogito, not a fundamentum inconcussum but a deposed, displaced and trembling heart, one who cannot so much as say "I" (61-64). Even when he speaks of God, this is not theology because it is not about God but a prayer to God, a confession of the incomprehensibility of God that lacks the logos of theology. We are warned repeatedly that every precaution must be taken to avoid the anachronism of reading Augustine in the light of the aftermath, contracting what takes place in the Confessions to the subject/object categories of Cartesianism, on the one hand, and to the categories of a theology immersed in the history of metaphysics, on the other hand.

While owing a great deal to Heidegger for all this, Marion wants to do Heidegger one better. For Heidegger -- who, like many major continental philosophers in the twentieth century, undertook an interpretation of the Confessions -- the task of reading Augustine was one of "retrieval" (Wiederholung), of extricating the Christian-factical experience of life (Luther's theology of the cross) from the deep overlay of Neoplatonic metaphysics (Luther's theology of glory) in which his work is immersed. Marion -- who is listening not to Luther but to Michel Henry on life and von Balthasar on Herrlichkeit -- will not concede even that much. For Marion everything takes place in the element of Christian confessio, of prayer and laudatio, and nothing that happens is metaphysics. What takes place does not belong to any idol made of "being," not even the "truth of Being" advanced by Heidegger, but to the horizon without horizon of "love" without measure or being.

This does not leave us lost for words in speaking of Augustine today. Rather readers of Marion's work will recognize at once that the signature terms of his thinking -- the "saturated phenomenon," "reduction" and "givenness" -- are here brought to bear upon reading the Confessions. If the Confessions belong anywhere, if this text has a place, it is the place of "donation," to which justice can be done only by a "phenomenology" of donation. Marion uses donation to translate Husserl's Gegebenheit, pure "givenness," which is the English translation he prefers. Against Husserl, he describes a phenomenon of excess whose givenness (fulfillment) overwhelms (saturates) its intention (concept) instead of falling short of it. In the process I think the meaning of Gegebenheit has shifted closer to the English transliteration "donation" (or maybe "gifting"), meaning a sphere or element, the air or "milieu," in which gifts take place -- God's giving and our being given, our being-given-to God (adonné, à Dieu) and God's self-giving, God as giving Godself to us as a gift and giving us to ourselves, and of our giving thanks and praise to God in return. That is the place in which the Confessions take place (avoir lieu).

The book is all about place: about God's place, and about the place and displacing of the self, and finally about the place of the Confessions itself. Derrida once said that Marion has a genius for titles, and this book is no exception. Au lieu de soi: seeking the place of the self; instead of or in place of the self; to or towards the self (see translator's note, xx). The book tracks "the approach" of (and to) Augustine, who pursues the way from the ego (moi) to the self (soi), whose place is in God (§43). The milieu of God means not so much that God is in us as that we are in God (243). I am where I love; there where I find God, I find myself (312).

The saturating givenness of the life of the soul by the life of God (Michel Henry) is compromised both by the Cartesian analogy and the analogy of being, a claim that draws upon Marion's theory of the three reductions. The first reduction, to transcendental subjectivity, is shown by Heidegger to compromise the openness and truth of Being (the second reduction). Even so, the second reduction, too, finally fails under the pressure of the third and ultimate reduction to unconditional givenness, which suspends the condition (or idolatry) still imposed by being. In his more recent works Marion calls this the "erotic" reduction, meaning the reduction of being to love (eros, desire, love), whose "univocity" upends Nygren's distinction between eros and agape (272-73) and alone provides the proper milieu of the Confessions.

Marion's book is a brilliant excavation of the richness of the Confessions in the light of the entire Augustinian corpus before they are carved up by the categories of metaphysical theology and entered into the polemics of theology. The book itself is a gift, an original, subtle, close and illuminating reading of Augustine, full of astute asides and rich documentation, altogether an enormously rewarding exercise to work through carefully. It is in short everything that we have come to expect from Jean-Luc Marion. If I have my differences with the argument, I do not mean to take anything away from this elegant book, which comes along with the additional gift of having been artfully translated by Jeffrey L. Kosky with his usual skill and acumen and his deep familiarity with the challenging language and thought of Marion.

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Put in the simplest philosophical terms, Marion presents the case that the Confessions and Augustine's corpus generally are to be taken as an exercise in phenomenology, not in the later metaphysical theology that would follow in Augustine's wake. My first concern is that Augustine is not, perhaps, as innocent of metaphysics as Marion would have us believe; he has not so much been overtaken by a later metaphysical theology as he has launched it. Augustine is not only the beautiful soul portrayed here; he also has a taste for theological polemics and heresiology that is surpassed by few. Augustine is the author not only of the haunting prayers of the Confessions but also of the scary citadels erected in the City of God and of a highly strident heresiology -- over twenty of his treatises are entitled contra this or that or somebody! For Augustine, the unmistakable place of truth is the Roman Catholic Church, and when it comes to the Church, truth does not mean phenomenological manifestness, but getting the Church's propositional assertions right, and if one dissents that is due to one's perverted nature. If truth means love, it means tough love. The famous saying "love and do what you will" (dilige et quod vis fac) meant that we have a lot of leeway in dealing harshly with heretics if our motive is the love of the Catholic faith. As always, there is a thin line between love and violence.

Among a series of acutely sensitive phenomenological analyses of the self, memory, time, truth, creation and God made by Marion, I choose three to illustrate both what Marion makes of Augustine and my own concerns.

(1) Heidegger famously said that the faith of the theologians prevented them from asking the question of being. They come to the question with a foregone conclusion that beings are creatures made by God and with a pre-understanding of being in terms of production (Herstellen), which is forgetful of Greek poiesis and is an antecedent to modern Technik. To Marion, this objection is surprisingly obtuse, forcing the Scriptures to answer a question they never asked (232-33). The Confessions, like the Scriptures, are cast not in causal but in confessional language; they speak not of effects but of gifts. They are not out to prove a prime mover but to praise and proclaim the goodness of God, the giver of all good gifts. Creatures are the issue of love not of some cosmic source of energy, and as such they are, like love itself, without why.

Without denying this perceptive rendering of the text, the question remains how well Augustine's confessional language is insulated from metaphysics, or how far praise is from predication. Are they not completely compatible and complimentary, in fact, mutually interdependent? They are no more incompatible -- and no less interdependent -- than honoring one's parents while also wanting to know their medical history. We are causally dependent upon our parents in the order of being even as we honor them in the order of love beyond being. Just so, creatures speak to us on two levels when they say "he made us;" they are saying, God really did draw us out of nothing (causality) and our very existence proclaims God's glory (confessio) and all the credit belongs to God, not to us. Indeed, the Scriptures are praising God's works (tua opera), not merely the world's beauty, and their praise is proportioned to the degree to which God deserves this credit. Indeed, the God who creates ex nihilo is ironically not a teaching of the Scriptures at all (where there are preexistent elements). It is an innovation of second century theological speculation devised to argue that the Christian creator God is worthy of higher praise than a pagan Demiurge. Were someone to deny the truth of this second century theological doctrine, they would feel the fury of Augustine and the sting of his very pointed stylus. If there were no metaphysical-theological predication standing virtually behind the praising, it would make no difference whether one praised a Demiurge, the creator ex nihilo, natura naturans or even blind chance.

(2) A similar question can be raised about Marion's reading of Augustinian time. He tries to displace the metaphysical distinction between time and eternity in Augustine by arguing that when Augustine speaks of the soul's fall into time the operative distinction is between the times (tempora), in which the soul leads a distracted and dissipated life occasioned by falling into sin, and authentic time (tempus), in which the soul by being converted is recollected unto God (225-26). Very nice -- but the soul that gathers itself together in temporal unity and intends or is extended to what lies ahead is on the high road to enjoying eternal life, where fleshless bodies cavort, all the limitations of corporeality and temporality having been removed. Everything that Augustine says about time presupposes that (metaphysical-theological) distinction.

(3) In still another suggestive analysis Marion shows that Augustine cultivates an erotic truth that lies beyond both the truth of being and propositional truth, one to which we cannot be indifferent because it is the truth that we must either love (because it illuminates) or hate (because it shines a light upon our faults) (109). But the limitation of this idea shows up in Augustine's episcopal preoccupation with "heretics," say the Manicheans, who do not love the truth because of the perversity of their nature (126). But how does Augustine know that? Maybe the Manicheans just see things differently than Augustine but in good faith? Standing behind the erotic truth, waiting for its cue if someone steps out of line, lies the big stick of doctrinal rectitude and propositional truth, which is the truth of the Catholic faith, over which Augustine stands constant guard. Erotic truth has its police.

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I think that Marion's argument would be strengthened by a simple confession that like Heidegger he too is engaged in a Wiederholung, fetching back a phenomenology of donation from a text that is also up to its ears in metaphysical theology. Marion's book would gain in credibility were he to confess that the place he is trying to stake out is a mixed neighborhood, with stretches of mystical theology, metaphysical theology and heresiology, and that his book is trying to displace the metaphysical theology by highlighting strains of a phenomenology of the saturated phenomenon. But that in turn would present Marion with a decisive problem, which brings me to another and more basic concern, that his phenomenology remains in complicity with the power of being. The third reduction is intended to isolate the pure givenness of the call, its pure phenomenality, to hear a pure call without being (= causality and propositionality). It must deprive the call of any metaphysical back-up, of any implicit or closet metaphysics, and allow it to speak for itself in its phenomenal structure as a call. The problem Marion has is that, not only is this not how the call functions in Augustine, it is not even how it functions in Marion himself.

Marion is certainly right to say that Augustine is not engaged in metaphysics in the modern (onto-theological) sense, in making idols of concepts, in deductive system building, and that Augustine prayerfully respects the incomprehensibility of God. But it is also obvious that Augustine's texts are laced with metaphysical-theological arguments (about the omniscience, omnipotence and benevolence of God as enshrined in his Catholic faith), and hence with propositional assertions to which he is fiercely attached, all of which draw deeply from a Neoplatonic well. In this connection it is interesting to observe that this book is based upon Marion's 2004 Etienne Gilson lectures. Gilson was the champion of Aquinas's philosophy of being, of God taken as ipsum esse per se subsistens, and the young Marion's God Without Being created a stir by challenging what had become an orthodoxy among Catholic philosophers in the twentieth century (see §§45-48). But Marion's God of love and Aquinas' God of being are alternate and complementary accounts of God's excess.

For Aquinas, God is subsistent love and the reason is that God is subsistent being, and love is being's finest glow. Esse subsistens is the best way Aquinas could express and protect God's incomprehensible excess. This reflects the Neoplatonic side of Aquinas, his version of the via eminentiae, which forced Marion to concede that esse subsistens is an icon not a metaphysical idol. Just so, in Marion himself, all the talk of God "without being" is his version of the via eminentiae, meaning not that God does not get as far as being, but that being does not get as far as God, which implies that being is virtually present, present by its power (virtus), eminentiore modo, in the excess of love. "Without being" means that being is included in but does not suffice to affirm the super-eminent excess, the super-being of the hyperousios, and this supports the entire discourse of love and donation in Marion. In short, Augustine (eternity), Aquinas (esse), and Marion (donation) are all agreed that God is the incompehensible hyperousios. The God of love and the God of being are ultimately compatible and mutually dependent and (historically contextual) alternate (substitutable) ways of formulating the excess of the hyperousios, of praising the hyper-eminence of God, of intensifying the eminence of God's being (without being, esse supra ens).

The one thing Marion does not do is to reduce this call to its pure phenomenality by depriving it of virtual contact with being. Were that purity more ruthlessly exposed, were the call laid bare more radically as a pure call, we would find that the place of the self is a desert, not the super-sacred desert of Eckhart's Godhead, like the agathon, but the desert within this desert, the khora-like desert of which Derrida speaks. Then the incomprehensibility of God would not be a way to praise God's eminence but a confession that cuts into our hide, an incision, a "circum-fession," that we really do not know who or what is calling, or what is being called for, or what we are being called to, or to what or whom we are responding. To "circumfess" that we do not know who we are, that we are a question to ourselves, would not be an affirmation of plenitudinous excess (saturation) but a confession of our exposure to a risky and unforeseeable future (desertification), a confession of unnerving radicality that is not to be found in Augustine, Aquinas, or Marion, not as such. The radical faith (foi) required to respond to such a truly naked (reduced) call would be deprived of the confidence that accompanies the Catholic creedal belief (croyance) that drives Augustinian theology and its companion heresiology, just as Marion himself once famously embraced the authority of the bishops to decide who has the right to teach. The task of reading (situating) Augustine radically would then lie in seeking the flickering traces of the desert place into which Augustine dares at times to wander in the Confessions.