Inborn Knowledge: The Mystery Within

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Colin McGinn, Inborn Knowledge: The Mystery Within, MIT Press, 2015, 137pp., $32.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262029391.

Reviewed by Peter Carruthers, University of Maryland


This book is mercifully short (just 102 smallish pages of main text). My review will attempt to match it for brevity.

The book is framed around the contrast between Lockean empiricism and Cartesian nativism. Locke held that the contents of the mind are more-or-less veridically impressed upon it from without. McGinn devotes considerable time to arguing that this is untenable, on a variety of grounds. The mind is not, and cannot be, a blank slate. It has structure, resulting from the unfolding of a genetic program. But of course no contemporary empiricist denies this. Almost everyone now allows that our sensory systems embody implicit knowledge of the structure of the world. Indeed Fodor (1981, 2008), whose nativism is in many respects even more extreme than McGinn's, grants to the empiricist what McGinn claims as his own crowning contribution to nativism: that structure-determining sensory systems and primitive sensory concepts are innate. The contemporary disputes are mostly about the nature of the processes that take one from sensory content to the rest of the mind's contents.

(Interestingly, Fodor is not mentioned once in McGinn's book. McGinn asserts, furthermore, "None of the central figures of twentieth-century philosophy had anything much to say about the question [of innateness]." [p.90.] One can deduce that McGinn doesn't take Fodor to be a major figure. I disagree.)

McGinn infers from the fact that our ideas (concepts) have a (partly) endogenous source, deriving from structure inherent in our sensory systems, that those ideas, also, are innate. This inference is fallacious, as McGinn himself recognizes in another context. From the fact that we have an innately-structured language-acquisition mechanism, it does not follow that English and French are innate. They aren't. What is innate is the underlying capacity that enables one to learn English or French. And whatever is learned is not innate. The same holds for concepts, unless it can be shown that concepts aren't learned. To do that, one would need to examine the various theories of concept acquisition and show, either that they are inadequate, or that they fail to qualify as forms of learning. But McGinn does no such thing, beyond arguing that abstraction is not a viable method.

In fact much of the debate between contemporary nativists and empiricists concerns the nature of learning. All agree that the basic structure of the mind is innate (including mechanisms of learning), and most agree that most of the contents of the mind are learned. (Fodor is an exception.) The disagreements are about whether learning is all a matter of general-purpose statistical or probabilistic inference of some sort, or whether it involves structured domain-specific learning mechanisms (somewhat like the language-faculty, on a Chomskian view of the latter). Other debates concern whether there is "core knowledge" of particular domains outside of our sensory faculties, structured out of innate concepts. (For articles that engage with both sets of debates from a broadly nativist perspective, see the papers collected in Carruthers et al., 2005, 2006, 2007.) There are extensive literatures on these topics that McGinn would need to take account of in order to contribute usefully to 21st century nativism, but he does not.

None of this would matter if McGinn were intending only to offer an assessment of the disagreements about nativism that took place early in the modern era. But he isn't. His aim is to convince us that nativism is true, and then to convince us that it is deeply mysterious how it can be true. But to do either of these things he would first have to frame the nativist hypothesis to be consistent with what we already know about the structure of the mind and the course of its development, and he would then need to engage with the controversies that remain. But he does neither of these things.

As for McGinn's mysterianism about the innate mind, this is more asserted than argued for. Indeed, it is quite demanding to demonstrate that something cannot in principle be explained, but McGinn doesn't even make the attempt. What we do know, however, is that it is far too simple to state the problem as one of understanding how our ideas could be coded in our genes. In part this is because no one any longer thinks that anything is coded directly in our genes. Rather, development results from complex cascading interactions between genes and their environments. But it is also because of the fallacy noted above. Even supposing that the structure of our perceptual systems and basic learning mechanisms were coded in our genes, it would not follow that our ideas are coded-for likewise. Rather, they result from interactions between learning mechanisms and the perceptual environment and hence will, in part, depend on the structure of that environment.

To be sure, we do not know how to provide a detailed explanation that goes from genes, to development, to neural systems, to learning, to mental representation (ideas). But many thousands of smart, well-informed, people around the globe are working on aspects of this problem. Progress is being made. I see no grounds for claiming that no such explanation can ever be constructed.


Carruthers, P., Laurence, S., and Stich, S. eds. (2005). The Innate Mind: Structure and Contents. Oxford University Press.

Carruthers, P., Laurence, S., and Stich, S. eds. (2006). The Innate Mind: Culture and Cognition. Oxford University Press.

Carruthers, P., Laurence, S., and Stich, S. eds. (2007). The Innate Mind: Foundations and the Future. Oxford University Press.

Fodor, J. (1981). The current status of the innateness controversy. In his RePresentations, MIT Press.

Fodor, J. (2008). LOT 2: The Language of Thought Revisited. Oxford University Press.