Inconsistency, Asymmetry, and Non-Locality: A Philosophical Investigation of Classical Electrodynamics

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Mathias Frisch, Inconsistency, Asymmetry, and Non-Locality: A Philosophical Investigation of Classical Electrodynamics, Oxford University Press, 2005, 222pp, $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 0195172159.

Reviewed by Ronald Anderson, Boston College


"The fundamental consolidating role of Minimal Action is well brought out in connection with the electrodynamic potentials of moving charges. The important formulation by Liénard and later by Wiechert for the potentials of moving charges, though found to be necessary for a consistent analysis, seems hardly intelligible by itself: in this entangled domain mere following out of algebra, unchecked by interpretation, may lead anywhere." [Larmor 1927, Collected Works, Vol. 2. p. 653]

As this passage from Joseph Larmor attests, issues to do with the consistency and intelligibility of the analysis of electrodynamics, the analysis of moving charges, the mathematics of a potential formalism, and the question of the interpretation of the mathematics, extend well back in twentieth-century physics. Classical electrodynamics, though, has been on the edges of the philosophy of physics. Quantum theory and space-time theories have been more center stage, with the result that classical electrodynamics has appeared as conceptually unproblematic and the paradigm of a standard classical theory. That Larmor's issues all feature in Matthias Frisch's impressive exploration of the conceptual features of classical electrodynamics in Inconsistency, Asymmetry and Non-Locality demonstrates that issues to do with the interpretation of the formalism of classical electrodynamics, as well as the nature of the theory itself, persist in deep and interesting ways. One of the valuable features of Frisch's study is to suggest that the theory become more center stage for philosophers of physics.

Along with its project of conceptual exploration, Frisch's study leads one to bring this conceptual analysis to bear on a particular notion of scientific theory taken to be common among philosophers of science. In broad terms, this conception maintains that physical theories consist of a mathematical formalism together with an interpretation that largely entails attaching parts of the mathematical formalism to physical phenomena. The overall project of the study is to argue that due to unavoidable problems with the consistency of the formalism of electromagnetism, plus the need to attend to causal constraints that go beyond the formalism, far richer notions of interpretation are needed. Frisch's development of this project has a lot going for it although, as I'll indicate, there appears to be a crucial complexity as to what to count as interpretation.

While Frisch is not explicit about this, at heart this project also relates to that grand topic of philosophy of science regarding the nature of the relationship between mathematics and the world, i.e., the nature of the meeting place of the formal, abstract, symbolic, and necessary with the particular, concrete, empirical, and contingent. Localized studies of particular theories such as that undertaken by Frisch are the ones most likely to generate new insights on this topic.

The study is also within the fine tradition in philosophy of science of bringing the technical details of a contemporary physical theory to bear on more general issues to do with the nature of a scientific theory, and indirectly, on the task of building a metaphysics based on our best knowledge of the world. As Frisch observes, while quantum theory has displaced classical electrodynamics as a foundational theory in the microscopic realm, nevertheless, the classical theory remains a central one within contemporary physics. It forms the prototype of the gauge field theories that feature in descriptions of the basic interactions of nature and in this way has played an extraordinary role in twentieth-century physics.

One of the challenges of this study lies in the need in places for a graduate-level of technical knowledge of electrodynamics in order to follow the arguments. Moreover, since a good bit of the argument related to the nature of scientific theories depends on conclusions drawn from the details of electromagnetic theory, a somewhat formidable task awaits the reader (and reviewer) to engage with and assess the study. This complexity, though, is not new in philosophy of physics, and Frisch assists the reader in providing helpful introductory and summary statements to begin and end chapters as well as the book as a whole.

The book consists of nine chapters and begins with presenting what is taken as a "standard conception of scientific theories among philosophers of physics as well as philosophers of science more generally." Frisch summarizes this view:

scientific theories ought to be identified with certain mathematical structures and with a mapping function that determines the theory's ontology. The view can be expressed either syntactically, whereby the core of a theory is identified with a mathematical formalism, or semantically, whereby the core is identified with a class of models. Central to this conception is the assumption that the interpretative framework of a theory consists of nothing but a mapping function from bits of the formalism to the world. (p. 193)

Frisch's problems with this conception gather around two issues that set the overall structure of the book. The first arises from what Frisch takes as a natural association of the requirement of consistency with this conception of scientific theory, at least with its main formulations. Frisch's reasons here are at times subtle, but a formal logical point is central (which in its formal abstract nature may not be as relevant as Frisch wishes to maintain): that if consequences are to be derived from a theory in the manner of deductive logic, then an inconsistent theory is trivial in that any statement can be derived from it. The second is that the conception does not include the sort of causal notions that appear to be woven into actual scientific accounts of nature.

Chapters 2 and 3 take up the issue of consistency in classical electrodynamics and argue that there is an inherent inconsistency within the theory that together with its successful use by physicists indicates "implicit, content-based rules guiding the selective application of the theory's basic equations." (p. 193) The problem with the above conception of scientific theories is the failure to account for such rules.

The emphasis on the inconsistency of classical electromagnetism, as Frisch well recognizes, will surprise a good number of those familiar with the theory. The well recognized problem of the self-field and energy of charged particles is not so much the issue, or at least the immediate one, but one that arises from the standard energy conservation principle -- the theory does not allow for the energy radiated by accelerated charges to be related to the changes of kinetic energy of the charges and other sources of work done on the particles. For Frisch, the conclusion here, even after exploring various modifications, is a dramatic one:

The theory … scores very high on a number of criteria of theory assessment, such as conceptual fit, accuracy, and simplicity. Yet as I want to show next, it fails miserably on what may appear to be the most important demand -- the theory is mathematically inconsistent. (p. 32)

… the mathematical tools available for making this account ['of what the world is like'] precise are inconsistent (p. 46).

Yet, as we have seen, there does not seem to be a completely satisfactory and consistent mathematical formalism through which one can model such interactions … (p. 71).

Moreover, for Frisch, it appears likely that "physicists will never develop a corrected, consistent theory." (p. 45). The classical theory possesses explanatory power, nevertheless, and in that lies the problem with the traditional account of scientific theories. To explore this claim takes one to the heart of the challenge of the book in its engagement with the technical details of classical electromagnetism. Also, it requires tracing down the specialized studies on the topic since the questions as posed by Frisch do not form the mainline presentation of classical electrodynamics. The claim of inconsistency has not gone unchallenged; for example, in a recent response to the book, Gordon Belot has questioned the necessity of the particular force law invoked in the analysis ("Is Classical Electrodynamics an Inconsistent Theory?", online, 2005). I would venture two considerations that suggest more caution is needed in exploring foundational but traditionally overlooked issues such as these in classical electrodynamics. The first is the use of integral theorems (see p. 35), such as Gauss's divergence theorem that relates volume integrals to surface integrals, and Stokes' theorem relating line integrals to surface integrals. The mathematical basis of these theorems, on which their validity depends, is changed once time-dependent quantities (propagating fields) are introduced, as in the present issue (the issue again being one of the appropriate application of mathematics). The second concerns the ascription of particular field energies to particular points in the field. The observables of classical electromagnetism involve integral expressions over volumes and surfaces, and while there is a long practice (Maxwell does it) of "taking apart" such expressions to ascribe energy densities to particular points that sum to the appropriate limit, the manner in which this is done strictly goes beyond information given by the way the formalism confronts empirical reality.

Still, allowing Frisch's identification of a problematic cluster of issues related to the analysis of accelerating point charges and energy considerations, another conceptual issue arises that appears to undermine the manner Frisch takes such issues to challenge the traditional conception of scientific theory -- and thus to mute a key energy driving a central part of the study. The matter here concerns what counts as an "interpretation" of the mathematics of the formalism. Frisch's presentation stresses that an inconsistency is present in the mathematical formalism of the theory, the sort that present a powerful logical challenge to a theory application. However, to use a phrase from another contemporary discourse, that of continental philosophy and post-structuralist thought, it is "interpretation all the way down." In particular, the perceived inconsistency is generated by an already interpreted formalism, i.e., one that already entails a mapping function that embeds the formalism in physical phenomena. The physical ascription of a particular radiant energy term and the application of energy conservation principles is generating an inconsistency and not in a way that can primarily be characterized as a "mathematical inconsistency." The issue here is nothing but an elaboration of the fact that interpretation is always present: the very first equations in the book -- Maxwell's equations in chapter 2 -- immediately arrive with an interpretation, a mapping function, a physical referent to indicate their application. From this perspective then the issue is more one of allowing sufficient richness in the "mapping function" of the traditional conception of scientific theories to incorporate the practice of physics in successfully using classical electrodynamics.

Chapters 5 to 7 take up the second problem and argue that to account for an apparent temporal asymmetry in the propagation of radiation, various causal notions are required since the underlying mathematical formalism is symmetric on these matters; and here again features are identified that are not accounted for by the general conception of scientific theories. Here Frisch presents a comprehensive and rich exploration of ways to account for the time-asymmetric "arrow of radiation" of electromagnetic waves, given that mathematically Maxwell's equations are time-symmetric and allow solutions that are "retarded" (diverging from sources) and "advanced" (converging on sources). Thus, there arises the question of what is needed to guide the interpretation of the mathematics of electromagnetism. To Frisch the most plausible response takes the form of a time-asymmetric "causal constraint" -- the one most likely picked up in basic courses on electromagnetism -- viz. a "retardation condition, according to which the field association with a charged particle is a diverging wave" (p. 20). This section of the book includes a valuable historical consideration of Einstein's discussion of the asymmetry as well as Wheeler and Feynman's absorber theory of radiation. The contemporary interlocutors in the background here include Huw Price and H. D. Zed.

Frisch's reading of the long discussions exploring alternative accounts to this problem is that they arose with a fixation on the mathematics of the theory without recognizing the need for such conditions as causal constraints (p. 163). In terms of his critique of the standard account of theories, he concludes:

… standard accounts of theories which strictly identify theories with a set of dynamical laws and a mapping function specifying the theory's ontology are too thin. Contrary to what Russell has famously argued, 'weighty' causal claims seem to play an important role even in fundamental physics. (p. 164)

The point here is surely a good one, but, I'd suggest, one that can be expressed as the general need, when interpreting the mathematics of a theory, to attend to a wide range of features of the phenomena for the selection of relevant solutions afforded by the basic equations. With a statement in this form, however, some of the edge of Frisch's position is muted.

Related to this contextualizing of Frisch's two themes, I have suggested, there is evident a narrative style where positions are proposed in a particular form in order to allow forceful points to be made against them. Thus, the "mapping function" of the standard account of theories is presented as unable to handle the scientific practice of navigating around inconsistency of the theories and being of a sort where causal considerations are excluded. While the resultant account of the nature of scientific theorizing is a rich and nuanced one, with an appropriate stress on the interpretative frameworks that go with the mathematical structure of the theory, one senses in places a dramatic rhetorical structure that arises from generating an "opposition" of this sort that serves to heighten the significance of the results of the exploration. Another feature of style of the text is the hesitant manner of stating positions, evident in the use of the words such as "seem" and "appear." This is evident in positions that serve as a foil for presenting the arguments such as with the traditional criteria for evaluating scientific theories-- "internal consistency appears to be privileged" (p. 25) and "causal structures simply do not seem to be needed in fundamental physics" (p. 77). Other examples appear in the quotations above. The textual stress on "inconsistency" that dominates the first part of the book has resonances with the rhetorical flair of Nancy Cartwright's analysis of our "dappled world," in addition to exemplifying a sound lesson of her study in such a world that discussions in realms in philosophy of science seldom ask how a theory "serves to model the world." (The Dappled World, 1999, p. 230).

The book concludes with a solid critique of the consequences of such a causal interpretation of electromagnetic radiation for David Lewis's counterfactual account of the asymmetry of causation. In addition, between the two main topics of the book ­-- inconsistency and the arrow of radiation -- a chapter explores how various notions of locality apply to the analysis of electromagnetic phenomena, with again the theme of the importance of causal conditions in the analysis. One of the old and intriguing themes raised in this chapter is the status of the mathematical structures of potentials in classical electromagnetism. As Frisch indicates, two standard reasons are usually given as to why they should be viewed merely as part of the mathematical superstructure of the theory and not be taken to refer directly to physical properties: 1) only their derivatives and not their absolute values map to physical features and 2) there are a variety of gauge fixing conditions that alter the propagation properties of potentials. The very language of referring to the standard E and B terms, which can be calculated from the potentials, as the "field strengths" terms, subtly loads the interpretation that they are the terms more in touch with representing physical phenomena. Inspired by the interpretation of the Aharonov-Bohm effect in quantum theory, there is a mode for interpreting potentials physically in terms of gauge- invariant loop integrals over space-time, although these introduce a non-local, nonseparable holonomy factor into the description of classical electromagnetism.

My own take on this is that from the perspective of gauge field theory, potentials are woven into the depth structure of electromagnetism. They represent directly the gauge fields within the formalism (as connections on a fiber bundle) and form a necessary part of the dynamical formulation of gauge fields. Also, they are the way quantum theory is fused with field theory and for this cluster of reasons form the key terms in the description of electromagnetism. Moreover, they encode the full information from which physical phenomena can be calculated. These features suggest they can be seen as capturing directly the physical phenomena of electromagnetism and in a richer way than traditionally allowed by a mapping of their mathematical structure to physical phenomena. The standard argument that a quantity represents a physical feature if its numeral value maps directly to a measurable quantity in a one-to-one manner arguably need not be a necessary criterion for ascribing physical reality to terms in the mathematical structure, especially as one traces how this criterion is tied to older classical notions of physical theories. In the spirit of the book -- that the mapping of mathematics to physical phenomena be enriched beyond traditional conceptions -- there is reason to rethink the standard discussions about the physical reality to be ascribed to the potential formalism.

It may be that the central lesson of the study resides in this point: mainline theories of physics, in this case classical electrodynamics, when explored with the care and depth of Frisch's study, reveal rich complexities that go with associating the mathematical formalism of the theory with physical phenomena. Strategies governing the selective use of the mathematical relationships of the theory that include attention to causal features and other aspects not embedded directly within the mathematical formalism are all part of the practice of science. This is an excellent lesson, and one that underlines how various traditional and formal reconstructions of how theories function in science, undertaken within philosophy of science contexts, sometimes miss that rich dimension of science.