Indian Buddhist Philosophy

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Amber Carpenter, Indian Buddhist Philosophy, Acumen, 2014, 313pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781844652983.

Reviewed by Christopher Bartley, University of Liverpool


This is a closely argued and engaging book discussing the varied and sophisticated Buddhist philosophical traditions. It is an ideal introduction for philosophers wanting to learn about Buddhist thought. Amber Carpenter encourages us to consider the viability as a moral outlook for ourselves a range of ideas stemming from the teachings of Gautama, the enlightened one (the Buddha), who renounced the everyday social life and ritualistic religion of his day in favour of detachment and homelessness. She likens the Buddhist philosophers to the classical Greeks in their belief that, as the late Iris Murdoch put it, metaphysics is a guide to morals where metaphysics means the edifying attempt to understand the world and our relation to it. Furthermore, both Greeks and Buddhists were concerned with the question 'How should I live?' for living well is the key to happiness that will not run away. Whether the Buddhist traditions supply a viable outlook outside their contexts of life is a matter that calls for caution. Here are a couple of points. First, Buddhism is a world-renunciatory monastic religion in which the role of the laity amounts to supporting the order of monks and observing basic moral maxims such as don't kill, steal, tell lies, sleep around or get drunk. Secondly, there doesn't appear to be much future in any version of 'naturalized karma' (discussed pages 111-116). This means dropping the belief in rebirth, where heredity is karmic (and hence moral) rather than genetic. It means the restriction of karma to the psychological domain. This would be an admission that the Buddhist tradition had hitherto been mistaken in many respects, the most important of which is that its notion of karma has always been a naturalistic one anyway. That is to say, the world is believed to be organized in accordance with the intentional actions of sentient beings.

Carpenter begins with a judicious consideration of Gautama's discovery of the moral and metaphysical nature of the cosmos and especially the idea that suffering is basic. (1) Everything is dukkha. (This Pāli noun used to be translated as suffering when that word had connotations of passivity and pain, and it is so treated by Carpenter. Most now translate it as 'unsatisfactory'.) (2) Suffering is caused (by desire and ignorance). (3) There is an end to suffering (nirvāṇa). (4) There is a means to that end (a life of moral cultivation and mindfulness).

These 'Noble Truths' are linked to the Three Jewels: everything is impermanent; everything is unsatisfactory; everything is insubstantial (anattā).

The ramifications are manifold, and Carpenter leaves few stones unturned as she shows how Buddhist moral precepts flow from its metaphysics, emphasising the primacy of correct views and also that concepts condition perceptions, and beliefs condition desires, interests and antipathies. But what was so striking about these pronouncements, and how did they help propagate what became an Asia-wide movement? A suggestion is that to people who were convinced that they were trapped in a cycle of rebirth (saṃsāra) thanks to the accumulated and accumulating consequences of their own actions (karma) it came as a liberating revelation that one cannot be a soul -- a permanent substantial nature -- because there are no substances, and thus could not be enslaved by a karmic cycle. One suffered because one misconceived oneself as an originally independent self-determining being that had become a passive victim of forces beyond its control. Detachment from suffering (burning with greed, resentment and delusion) arises from the realisations that we are not victims but just ephemeral fluxes of perceptions, feelings, thoughts, and inherited characteristics in an impersonal process of interdependent events, and that although we do not really matter we can at least be kinder to each other. There is no reason to be selfish. Moreover, virtuous actions and meditation will extinguish (nirvāṇa) the fires of greed, resentment and delusion by which the fluxes we call persons are held together. A set of characteristics -- a stream of experiences -- is not fixed, and there's the possibility at any moment of creating the future of the stream (which obviously won't be me) because karma is just a matter of intentions. Overall, the good news is that it cannot be you who is in bondage to rebirth since there is no you.

These ideas would be elaborated in various philosophical systems (helpfully mapped on page xviii): Sarvāstivādins held that real external objects were perceptible, Sautrāntikas said that a mind-independent domain of energies was inferable but not perceptible and, in any case, indeterminate relative to our concepts and language, Yogācārins thought that there were only experiences. Mādhyamikas avoided positive metaphysical claims other than denying that there were any intrinsic natures (svabhāva) and hence a criterion to distinguish conditioned and unconditioned modes of existence, saṃsāra and nirvāṇa. The central doctrines of all these schools are elegantly presented, explained and discussed by Carpenter.

Early Buddhists challenged a family of Brahmanical beliefs that included the notion that one is a transcendent entity that could nevertheless accumulate merit from the performance of ritual and ascend to higher planes of being where it might enjoy the fruits of its actions. There was also the possibility that this being might be released (mukti or mokṣa) from the cycle of rebirth, rewards and penalties when through a process of interiorisation it realized its identity with the innermost principle of the cosmos. It is generally agreed that the Buddha denied that we are immortal souls: the belief that we are such only served to perpetuate the series of births. The question of whether he thought that we might in some other sense be continuous entities has been extensively discussed for well over 2000 years and is the subject of Chapter 2.

There were some (called Pudgalavādins) who attempted to reconcile the tenets of ephemeral impersonality and moral responsibility by claiming that from the interactions of feelings, perceptions, thoughts and habits there emerged a sort of personal being, but they were always regarded as heretics. Basically, the mainstream Buddhist view was and is that each moment of experience is reflexive. The successive nature of experiences generates the illusion that there is a single persisting entity that owns them. Carpenter rightly argues that the distinctively Buddhist view goes beyond the rejection of substantial souls to include even complexes of experiences and actions that might just last for the time being.  Brahmanical Nyāya (and other) philosophers pose the questions of what is the mistake in wrongly supposing themselves to be continuous entities and of how discrete moments can conceive of themselves as continuous. Carpenter lucidly presents these controversies in Chapter Six in a discussion of how distinct sensory modalities can yield synthetic information in the absence of an independent principle as the agent of unification.

I'm not sure that Carpenter is on the right track when she describes the Abhidharmikas' metaphysics as 'non-categorial' unless she just means that it differs from that of the Aristotle of the Categories. This is misleading in that it may obscure appreciation of those developments of Buddhist thought that are reactions to Abhidharma: to wit, the Madhyamaka repudiation of essences and the fundamentalist Sautrāntika reversion to a more parsimonious ontology. An Abhidharma text is a systematic classification of essences (svabhāva), a ramified theory of types if ever there was one. There is a basic distinction between material and mental elements (dharmas) as well as a luxuriant taxonomy of classes encompassing everything: moods, emotions, virtues, vices, wood, earth and water, to name a few. Aristotle's words apply here, 'There is no such kind of things as the things that there are.' So it would be a mistake to conclude that there is only one way of being.

As anyone who has ever read Nāgārjuna in Sanskrit knows, on the face of it the Mūlamadhyamakakārikā lends itself to the multifarious interpretations that it has received. Collingwood said that the key to historical understanding was finding the question to which the text was an answer. This is particularly true where the interpretation of Nāgārjuna is concerned. The problem is that all too often we have lost sight of the specific Buddhist controversies to which he was responding. This has opened the door to a hermeneutic orgy, lasting well over a century.

The presentation of Nāgārjuna's Madhyamaka in Chapter Four tellingly brings out the way in which the idea that everything is empty of essence (svabhāva-śūnya; śūnyatā) goes beyond a critique of substance in its claim that there are not even derivative or conventional entities but just flux (although Nāgārjuna would avoid the latter positive claim). The doctrine is said to be an extrapolation of the principle of universal interdependence. Internalisation of the idea that interdependence entails non-identity tranquillizes the discursive thinking that impedes serene contemplation. The point of the teaching is the elimination of all theories about ontology. He is promoting a form of moral ameliorisation that obviously cannot be the enhancement of any particular individual. It is worth emphasizing that 'emptiness' always abbreviates 'empty of essence' and that the notion is primarily directed against the Abhidharma writers.

I doubt whether Nāgārjuna ever entertained the idea that 'ultimate reality is without self' where 'without self' translates anattā (pp.78-79). He might have meant that the real is insubstantial, which is what anattā often means (although he would have thought that even that would have been a step too far in the direction of reification). When Buddhists said that all conditioned things were anattā, they did not mean that they were without self, selfless, not-self, soulless or whatever. They meant that they were insubstantial as well as ephemeral. A Sanskrit formation such as ghaṭa-ātman does not mean the self/soul of the pot; it means the nature of pots. More germanely, a compound such as grāhaka-ātman might mean 'the perceiving self' but is more likely to mean 'x whose nature is the perceiver'. The words ātman (Skt) and attan (Pāli) often mean 'nature' as well as their narrower uses as 'soul' or 'self'.

When Carpenter observes (p.141) that the word ātman appears in Vasubandhu's Twenty Verses (v.21 and comm.) there is no occasion for surprise. Incidentally, the translation quoted on page 141 is as wrong as the one by Stefan Anacker cited in the notes. The maligned Fernando Tola and Carmen Dragonetti are closer. Here is the right version, lacking 'nature' let alone self:

Other minds are cognitively accessible only to enlightened beings in virtue of their ineffability (nirabhilāpyena-ātmanā). Given that we don't understand our own or other minds, we do not recognise the truth. This is because we have not eliminated the subject-object dichotomy that is a false representation.

The presentation in Chapter Seven of Yogācāra (which may innocently be called idealism since they deny matter and say that there are only fleeting and insubstantial experiences) explains Vasubandhu's twofold strategy of demonstrating that no sense can be made of the realist notion of mind-independent matter and that the panoply of experiences is intelligible without external physical objects. Carpenter deserves a medal for her explication of the 'Three Natures' doctrine.

The final chapter deals with Dignāga's view, developed by Dharmakīrti, that our woe derives from a failure to realise that there is a huge gap between the way things are and the way our conceptualizing minds work. There is also an exposition of the Mādhyamika Bhāviveka's view that the idealists are attributing substantiality to a repository of ideas that resembles an absolute mind. Candrakīrti develops the critique.

A short review cannot do justice to this rich and penetrating work. It is to be hoped that it enjoys wide circulation.

A proof-reading note:  The table on page xviii contains a number of misspellings. The correct forms are: Siddhārtha; Sthavīravādins; Vibhajyavādins; Vibhāṣā; Āryadeva; Catuḥśataka; Buddhaghoṣa; Śāntarakṣita.