Individual and Conflict in Greek Ethics

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White, Nicholas, Individual and Conflict in Greek Ethics, Oxford University Press, 2002, 382pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0198250592.

Reviewed by Paula Gottlieb, University of Wisconsin-Madison


On the front cover of Nicholas White’s new book, Individual and Conflict in Greek Ethics, is a picture of William Blake’s rendition of the famous statue of Laocoon and his sons in violent conflict with two gigantic snakes.1 White describes how the influential eighteenth century German scholar Johann Joachim Winckelmann saw in this statue (which Winckelmann mistakenly thought to stem from the time of Alexander the Great) the harmony and serenity which he associated with the ancient Greeks, in contrast with the disharmony of his own age.2 According to White, modern philosophers are equally ridiculous when they look to the past and suppose that the main aim of ancient Greek philosophers was to show that all worthwhile human aims are in harmony with each other, in contrast with moderns who are far more aware of conflict. White’s aim is to debunk the idea that there is a homogeneous group, “the Greeks”, who held such a contrasting view, and to present “something like a prolegomenon to a history of Greek ethics—a piece of ground-clearing” (p. xiii) to show how the idea gained currency and why it is mistaken. By tracing views about ancient Greek philosophy from the eighteenth to the twenty-first century, White also aims to convince his readers of the importance of historiography. The book addresses a broader readership than specialists in ancient Greek philosophy.

According to White, the historical story goes as follows: Europeans of the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries, disillusioned with what they saw as the modern condition of disharmony and fragmentation, had uncritical admiration for what they considered to be the harmony of ancient Greece, its culture, art, sculpture, architecture and political institutions. Modern philosophers are unwittingly heir to this tradition when they attribute to all the ancient Greek philosophers a matching philosophical view aimed at minimizing conflicts in practical reasoning. According to this view, which White calls “harmonizing eudaimonism”, (a) each human being has a single ultimate rational aim, happiness (eudaimonia) and (b) all worthwhile aims are harmoniously subsumed under this one aim in such a way that (c) happiness cannot conflict with any other (rational) aim beyond itself. On White’s account, when Kant suggested that happiness may indeed conflict with something beyond itself, reason, and that inclination and duty may provide conflicting considerations, those who opposed him, notably Schiller and Hegel, relied on a harmonizing eudaimonist interpretation of ancient Greek philosophy to make their case. In the nineteenth and twentieth century the debate continued: According to White, Kantians, for example, Sidgwick and Prichard, argued that Greek eudaimonism is mistaken, and hegelians, for example, Green and other British idealists, thought that Greek harmonizing eudaimonism is correct. In White’s view, discussion of Greek ethics has now come to be dominated by Kantians and Hegelians, with Hegelians gaining the upper hand. There are two modern Hegelian strategies developed in response to the Kantian view, according to White, the fusionist strategy according to which one’s own good just is identical with the good of others, and the inclusivist strategy according to which one’s own good includes the good of others. White argues that Hegel’s views on harmony in the Greek polis spawned both these views. Finally, there are other modern philosophers, for example, Anscombe, Williams and MacIntyre, who think that ancient philosophical thought is significantly different from our own. According to White, none of these philosophers have a correct view of what the ancient Greeks thought, and they all, like Winckelmann, mistakenly treat classical Greek thought as homogeneous and paradigmatic.

In order to pave the way for his thesis that the Greeks could and did recognize conflicts between different rational considerations, and to show that this occurred more in the classical period than later, White discusses imperatival language in ancient Greek poetry, drama, history and philosophy. There then follows a chapter apiece on Plato, Aristotle and Hellenistic philosophers. White argues that, while it is unclear whether Socrates is a harmonizing eudaimonist, neither Plato nor Aristotle is, but for different reasons. Finally, White argues that Hellenistic philosophers, in particular Epicureans and Stoics, are harmonizing eudaimonists, but, he claims, this marks the ultimate irony, since those moderns who favor harmonizing eudaimonism are not at all partial to Hellenistic philosophy.

In the following I shall first make a few comments on White’s historiography and then raise some points about the Greek philosophers.

The Historical Story

It is unclear why White begins with eighteenth-century scholarship, since Winckelmann himself relies heavily on Roman authors, especially Pliny, for his views about Greece and Greek art. (Even so, Winckelmann disagrees with Pliny that Greek art ended with the death of Alexander the Great, arguing that it continued in Sicily and was kept alive by the Romans.3 ) Not all of the major philosophical figures fit White’s trajectory. White himself notes Nietzsche and G. E. Moore as exceptions. Hegel, according to White, did not think that classical Greek thought was homogeneous. White also downplays the influence of Utilitarianism on the British philosophers, with the strange result that Sidgwick is classified as a Kantian, because he distinguishes egoistic and universal reasons. In discussing Anscombe’s and Williams’ comparisons between modern and ancient philosophy, White only briefly mentions that their animus is directed as much towards utilitarianism as it is towards Kant.

White classifies many twentieth-century commentators as Hegelian inclusivists, but ’inclusivism’ in Aristotelian scholarship, as White himself notes, is a term of art. The modern debate about inclusivism concerns whether Aristotle thinks that happiness includes all goods and good activities or whether instead he thinks that happiness consists in only one activity, for example, contemplation. Hardie, Ackrill and Cooper, leading inclusivists on White’s account, are not debating other philosophers who share their view that Aristotle is an inclusivist, but disagree about whether inclusivism is correct; the present debate concerns what Aristotle’s view actually is. To complicate matters further, the participants disagree about whether Aristotle is consistently an inclusivist or not. Hardie thinks that Aristotle is confused. Ackrill and early Cooper think that Aristotle is an inclusivist in the bulk of his Nicomachean Ethics, but not in book X.4 More recently, increasingly sophisticated and more far-reaching versions of non-inclusivism and inclusivism have been propounded, for example by Kraut and Irwin respectively, but the dispute remains a dispute about the interpretation of the Greek text.

Finally, as a result of a new turn in Kantian scholarship, according to which Kant’s ethics differs from the version attacked by Schiller, Aristotelian commentators now see the relationship between Kant’s and Aristotle’s ethics in a new light. White is dismissive of this trend, but it is gaining ground. In short, modern commentators on Aristotle do not easily fit White’s Hegelian versus Kantian classifications, and their views are no more homogeneous than those of his ancient Greeks.

The Philosophers

First, Plato. White’s main argument centers on Plato’s claim that it is just for the guardians of the ideal city to stop contemplating the Forms in order to rule in the city. According to White, they face a conflict between their happiness and a broader aim, and they are required to make a sacrifice in order to rule. On the face of it, White’s interpretation means that Plato has not fully answered the challenges posed early on in the Republic to show how justice is not just somebody else’s good, and is of intrinsic value to oneself. The alternative “harmonizing eudaimonist” interpretation, according to which the guardians’ ruling is in their own interest after all, would appear to be more promising. To combat this view, White returns to the beginning of the Republic and argues that it contains another important challenge that the harmonizing eudaimonist interpreters have overlooked. White points to Thrasymachus’s description of justice as “high-minded foolishness (gennaia euEtheia)” (Rep I 348C) and argues that Thrasymachus is posing the following challenge, “… why does it make any sense to follow the belief, which many people in fact hold, that one rationally should do certain things because they are “just”, even though one sees that they are inimical to one’s own good?” (p. 171) This is an ingenious suggestion, but the text tells against it. Thrasymachus says that he thinks that injustice is not a vice because it pays. When Socrates asks him whether he therefore thinks that justice is a vice, Thrasymachus says no, it is “high-minded foolishness”. To see what Thrasymachus means, we need only turn back a few pages. There Socrates is arguing that rulers, like shepherds, look after their flocks, rather than fleece them. “Oh, most foolish Socrates (O euEthestate SOcrates)” exclaims Thrasymachus before he launches into his famous tirade, “you must see it in this way, that the just man is in every circumstance worse off than the unjust man” (Rep I 343D).

Let us suppose, though, that White’s interpretation of deliberative conflict is correct. Consider the following passage, Republic VII 520E-21. White, following Grube, translates the first part thus (p. 204):

If you can find a way of life which is better than governing for the prospective governors, then a well-governed city can exist for you. Only in that city will the truly rich rule, not rich in gold but in the wealth which a happy man must have, a life with goodness and intelligence.

The next part of Grube’s translation runs,

If beggars hungry for private goods go into public life, thinking that they must snatch their good from it, the well-governed city cannot exist, for then office is fought for, and such a war at home inside the city destroys them and the city as well.

A harmonizing eudaimonist can interpret the passage to mean that the rulers will view harmony among themselves and the citizens as necessary for their own happiness; if there is war in the city there will be no happiness, contemplative or otherwise, for themselves. On White’s view, however, the passage can only mean that the rulers’ better way of life must conflict with ruling, so that they will not be like Thrasymachean rulers, fighting for office, and so that harmony among the rulers and the citizens will prevail. On the harmonizing eudaimonists’ account, harmony serves eudaimonia; on White’s interpretation, it is the other way round. Harmony therefore turns out to have an even more important role in White’s version of Plato’s Republic than in the harmonizing eudaimonists’ account.

Next, Aristotle. White’s version of book X of Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics is similar to Kraut’s.5 Both White and Kraut distinguish happiness and the happy life and think that happiness consists in one activity, contemplation, although other goods are also included in the happy life. They also agree that contemplation and ethically virtuous activity can conflict. Here is where they part company. According to Kraut, the Aristotelian will give up contemplating to do ethically virtuous action, and so Aristotle is not a eudaimonist (or an egoist, in Kraut’s terms). According to White, the Aristotelian will prefer contemplation and so Aristotle is a eudaimonist, but not a harmonizing one, after all.

A full and fair discussion of White’s interpretation would require a thorough account of Aristotle’s ethics including the ethical virtues, practical reasoning, friendship (which White discusses at length) and the doctrine of the mean. Instead, I wish to consider White’s conclusion, “[i]t cannot rightly be said that modern ethics lacks an important deliberative harmony that Aristotle’s view supplies.” (p. 282) Even on White’s own account, though, there are two important differences between Aristotelian and modern conflicts. First, contemplation and exercising ethical virtue are two types of happiness, according to Aristotle; there is no conflict between happiness and something else of a different kind, as there is on the Kantian view. Secondly, Aristotelian deliberation does lack one important type of conflict that moderns envisage, namely, irresolvable conflicts. These are non-trivial conflicts between rational considerations that are not rationally adjudicable in one way or another.

Finally, Epicurus and the Stoics. On White’s interpretation, they are “deliberative monists”. Not only do they espouse one ultimate rational aim in life, but also they think that there are no other worthwhile aims at all. White claims that it is ironic that they are not admired, given their harmonious views. Yet if their views are really as crude as White suggests (and his discussion of other commentators suggests that they are not), it would be no wonder if they were not as highly regarded as Plato and Aristotle. More importantly, if these are their views, they are not promoting deliberative harmony at all. To borrow an idea from Aristotle’s Politics, harmony is not the same as unison or monism; it requires disparate elements to be harmonized.

What, then, should we make of Winckelmann’s ideal? For anyone living in a world of war, strife, regime changes and faction, for example, ourselves, Europeans of the past three centuries, and the ancient Greeks, harmony would seem to be a worthwhile aim. Even Kant, to whom White attributes the crucial distinction between happiness and broader aims, was not averse to harmony. His reasoners are to think of themselves as belonging to a kingdom of ends in which all legislate and obey the same universal laws together.

When Socrates finishes describing the rulers of Plato’s Republic, Glaucon comments that Socrates has made them “very beautiful, just as a sculptor would” (Rep VII 540C). Winckelmann’s sensibility may not be so different from the classical Greeks’ after all.


1. Blake’s rendition can be viewed at . The statue seen by Winckelmann can be viewed at

2. In order to see what Winckelmann means, compare El Greco’s version of the myth at or click on Blake’s own version of the Laocoon struggle in section 4 of . Blake shares Winckelmann’s evaluation of classical Greek art, but not his admiration.

3. Winckelmann History of Ancient Art tr. G. Henry Lodge, (Boston: James R. Osgood and Co., 1880) vol 2 esp. p. 240. One of White’s main sources for Winckelmann’s era is Eliza Butler, The Tyranny of Greece over Germany (London: Macmillan, 1935) (repr. Boston: Beacon, 1958). For a less tendentious account, see, for example, Ronald Peacock, Hölderlin (London: Methuen, (1938) repr. 1973) pp. 6, 15, 88.

4. White is referring to Cooper’s book Reason and Human Good in Aristotle (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1975) (p. 33). An important part of Cooper’s argument was that Aristotle identified a human being with his nous or theoretical intellect. After the publication of Whiting’s argument that nous also has a practical side (“Human Nature and Intellectualism in Aristotle” Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie 68, 1986: 70-95), Cooper changed his mind about his interpretation of book X (“Contemplation and Happiness: A Reconsideration” Synthèse 72, 1987: 187-216). White resurrects Cooper’s original argument in his own discussion (p. 247).

5. R. Kraut Aristotle on the Human Good (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1989).