Individuation, Process, and Scientific Practices

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Otávio Bueno, Ruey-Lin Chen, and Melinda Bonnie Fagan (eds.), Individuation, Process, and Scientific Practices, Oxford University Press, 2018, 308pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190636814.

Reviewed by James DiFrisco, KU Leuven


The book is a collection of new work at the intersection of three themes that have received considerable attention in recent philosophy of biology: biological individuality, process ontology, and scientific practice. This is an important and innovative volume that advances the research discussion on central themes of major current interest. Below, I describe the new direction staked out in this book and explain why I think it is important, then I offer some critical remarks on the general framing of the book's proposed re-orientation toward scientific practice.

The chapters are topically heterogeneous, with the majority coming from philosophy of biology (John Dupré, John Pemberton, Marie I. Kaiser, C. Kenneth Waters, Melinda Bonnie Fagan, James Griesemer, Alan C. Love, Roberta L. Millstein) and a few from philosophy of physics (Ruey-Lin Chen, Alexandre Guay and Olivier Sartenaer, Otávio Bueno, Jonathon Hricko). The problems of individuality in these contexts have little in common. In philosophy of physics, the discussion of individuality has focused on whether elementary particles as understood in quantum theories fulfill the requisite identity and discernibility conditions to count as "individuals," from the perspective of traditional metaphysics. The realism versus empiricism issue looms large in discussions of whether and how particles are individuated. In biology, by contrast, it is not a terribly important question whether organisms, symbiotic collectives, or body parts are real or whether they are metaphysical individuals (i.e., concrete, persistent, particular, non-instantiable, discernible, etc.). They are both, and the more interesting issues lie elsewhere. Given how different these contexts are, and given that the most unified message of the volume is expressed in the philosophy of biology contributions, I focus only on common themes within the biological context.

The most central thesis of the book, formulated in the editorial introduction and re-affirmed in several chapters, is that individuation is prior to individuality (2-11, 140-1, 174, 193). I'll refer to this as the "priority thesis." Here, "individuality" refers to conceptions or theoretical criteria that specify what counts as an individual. "Individuation" has two primary senses: (1) the process whereby something in the world becomes an individual, and (2) the practical activity whereby human beings single out an individual by means of manipulation, observation, tracking, or experimental creation. The priority thesis involves a basic change of perspective, according to which "individuals are understood as products or outcomes of individuation as a process, rather than identified by principles or criteria of individuality applied to entities" (8). This priority thesis inverts the contrary thesis -- that individuality is prior to individuation -- which is attributed to mainstream analytic philosophy, theory-centric philosophy of science, and above all, that favorite target of philosophy of science: analytic metaphysics.

Although they are treated together as a unit, the different senses of individuation yield quite different versions of the priority thesis. Priority thesis (1) is a metaphysical claim that the process of individuation, understood as the formation, emergence, composition, or maintenance of individuals (8), is prior to our application of criteria of individuality or identity to those process. This claim largely remains programmatic in the volume and doesn't receive a very detailed or precise treatment.[1]

As intriguing as this proposal might be, it is not clear that individuation understood as "becoming an individual" should be viewed as competing for priority with the use of criteria of individuality. Instead, one could argue that criteria of individuality, such as those embedded in sortal concepts, are needed for tracking processes of diachronic emergence and identifying when a new sort of individual has formed. Instead of priority, then, we would have reciprocity or interaction. Some of the book's authors (e.g., Griesemer, 138) acknowledge this sort of reciprocity while also affirming a process-centered approach.

Priority thesis (2) has several closely related meanings. One is that scientific practices of individuation are more basic than, autonomous from, or the ground of the individuation of objects described by scientific theory. Love, for example, persuasively argues that developmental biologists successfully track embryos and their parts without relying on any theory of development and without needing to consult evolutionary theory (165 ff.; see also Chen, 200 ff.). A more general formulation of priority thesis (2) is that the abstract conceptions, definitions, and criteria of individuality, which have dominated philosophical attention, are dependent on concrete cognitive or perceptual activities of individuation which often involve material interactions with the individuals. Priority thesis (2) is thought to lead inevitably to pluralism about biological individuality because scientific practices of individuation are, as a matter of fact, diverse (see introduction; Waters, Love, Griesemer, and Dupré). This cluster of ideas receives a more in-depth treatment in the book and constitutes what is, in my view, its most original and important contribution. Let me now explain this opinion in more detail.

In analytic philosophy, individuation is often treated as being primarily a semantic-metaphysical determination relation (e.g., Lowe 2009, 18), in which the relata are concepts and objects. A preoccupation with logical and linguistic aspects of individuation makes it seem as though the mere act of conjuring a definition can make its referents metaphysically distinct, even if the objects cannot actually be demarcated and tracked by cognitively finite agents like ourselves. The epistemic poverty of this attitude survives no less in the "naturalistic" adherence to Quine's dictum about ontological commitment -- that one should be committed to the entities posited in our best scientific theories. Quine is implicitly prioritizing theoretical concepts of individuality over practical activities of individuation. It is seldom recognized, however, that scientific theories often do not individuate the objects to which they apply.

A good example of a non-individuative theory is the theory of evolution by natural selection. It applies to objects so diverse that any encompassing characterization must be in terms of abstract functional properties. But abstract characterizations of "units of selection" do not actually pick out the material objects that participate in selection processes (Griesemer, 140). This task falls to areas of biology that lack overarching theories (development, genetics, ecology) and to more local contexts of practical knowledge. It is in these practical contexts that many of the individuation problems can be found. Yet, as the editors of the present volume rightly observe, most philosophers of biology do not challenge the assumption that "the concept of individuality is prior to that of individuation" (6).

Prioritizing individuation over individuality is a welcome move in this context for several reasons. It highlights the inadequacy of theoretical or formal accounts of individuality that remain silent on how to map the descriptors of the theory onto observationally or experimentally accessible objects. The shift towards individuation in scientific practice also points the way beyond the common assumption that if individuation is not guided by a scientific theory, then it must be based on "intuition." This erroneous assumption was pushed by no less than David Hull (1992) in one of his attempts to justify the fundamentality of evolutionary individuality. Perhaps most importantly, the prioritizing of individuation opens up interesting problems that would otherwise remain concealed. One such problem is that activities of individuation often have to materially alter the system they are practiced upon, and can sometimes only access the original target (if at all) via fallible inferences. An example is the experimental identification of differentiating and self-renewing stem cells, discussed in Fagan's chapter (114 ff.) This kind of phenomenon is a key epistemological obstacle to the individuation of components and activities in complex nonlinear systems, and deserves closer philosophical scrutiny.

The proposed re-orientation from individuality to individuation is less helpful, however, when it is framed in an overly oppositional manner. Claims of priority -- in either direction -- are difficult to assess because the individuation of scientific objects is not a simple two-step procedure. It is not a matter of taking the predicates from a theory and checking which entities in the world instantiate the corresponding properties. But neither is it a matter of a non-conceptual encounter with raw material stuff that only later may be conceptualized using criteria of individuality. It is more plausible to think of individuation in science as a complex, iterative process in which workers are usually moving back and forth between more abstract conceptualization and more engaged activities of detection, manipulation, and interaction. If individuation is a cognitively holistic and iterative process akin to hypothesis testing, then it takes place in a hermeneutic circle in which there may be no identifiable beginning or end to which we can attribute epistemological priority.

The distinction between scientific theory and practice also sometimes suffers from an unhelpful oppositional style of presentation, especially when scientific theory gets lumped together with criteria and conceptions of individuality. It is certainly important to recognize the limited role of theories in the individuation of biological entities, but the point gets easily over-extended. Biology may have few theories but it has plenty of theory and theorizing, and the latter can and should inform practices of individuation. Theorizing itself can be viewed as a practice that grades into more hands-on forms of investigation. Even when scientific practice is not heavily theory-laden, such as in some experimental contexts, it is infused with conceptualizations and working criteria of individuality that enable workers to navigate problems and interpret results. So again, rather than competing for priority, criteria of individuality and practices of individuation are more plausibly viewed as mutually supporting and revising one another in an iterative fashion.

The concept-ladenness of scientific practice starts to get at one of the reasons why analytic philosophy and philosophy of science tends to maintain a priority of individuality thesis. It is a lesson inherited from the demise of logical empiricism, and particularly the failed project of reducing theoretical statements about unobservable entities to observation reports. This project failed in part because of the growing recognition that there is no clean partition of experience into a logical, linguistic, inferential, and/or conceptual side, operating on a separable domain of observations, sense-data, or "givens" (Sellars 1963, chs. 5 and 10; 1968, ch. 5). Instead, observation (and, one might add, action) is intertwined with conceptual activity, which will often include the application of concepts of individuality.

These kinds of considerations, which have been highly influential in supporting the priority of individuality view, receive little to no engagement in the present volume. This is understandable as a topical limitation, but it makes the polemical vector of the volume against mainstream analytic philosophy and philosophy of science less effective than it could have been.

A specific example of a missed opportunity for engagement pertains to the sortal concepts view of individuality (3), which in my view is the strongest of the metaphysical views criticized in the editorial introduction. According to sortalism, claims about individuation and identity of objects require that those objects are traced under sortal concepts, or kinds possessing determinate criteria of identity for their instances (see Wiggins 2001; Lowe 2009). Since sortals are specific to different kinds of things, this is in fact the opposite of a naïve monism in which "criteria of individuality and the principles of individuation are supposed to be universally applicable to all entities in the world" (3). The key argument for sortalism is that without well-defined sortals, claims of identity and individuation often have no determinate truth value. This is usually demonstrated by describing problematic scenarios involving substantive change (e.g., Theseus' ship) or ambiguous counting (e.g., the number of red things in a room), which are insoluble without prior determinations about the sort of thing one is tracking or counting. One can easily exchange these armchair scenarios for actual individuation problems in biology -- problems that may be as practical as one likes -- in order to generate useful prescriptions for improving our individuative concepts (DiFrisco 2018). Here, input from a focus on practice could show concretely how conceptualization is just one aspect of scientific individuation as an iterative process.

By now I hope to have provided some grounds for a more conciliatory rather than oppositional perspective on the relation between individuality and individuation, as well as the attendant relation between metaphysics and scientific practice. This conciliatory stance will be unacceptable, however, to those who understand individuation in scientific practice as a kind of antidote to metaphysics. In the present volume, the most radical example of this attitude is Waters' chapter (91 ff.). Waters advises philosophers to ask not "what is a biological individual?" but instead to ask "how do biologists individuate things?," "for which purposes?," and "do their practices of individuating things serve these purposes?" This methodological shift issues in an anti-metaphysical stance based on pluralism, pragmatism, and instrumentalism about biological concepts.

Waters' primary example is the individuation of genes. He points out that classical genetics individuated genes without knowing what genes are, what they are made of, or how they function (93). In molecular genetics, attempts to cut the molecular gene "at its joints" in terms of DNA quickly revealed that there were "too many joints" -- i.e., cross-cutting and partially overlapping genes individuated for different purposes (96). Although some philosophers have found this pluralistic state of affairs to be objectionable, in fact the flexibility of individuation practices has been conducive to the purposes of biologists (95). These purposes include explanation, prediction, manipulation, and most importantly, investigation (97). Waters writes: "Answering the question 'what is it to be a gene?' does not provide important metaphysical insights into the functioning or development of organisms" (98). The same argument is then extended to the individuation of organisms (98 ff.).

In claiming that classical geneticists didn't need to know what genes are, Waters seems to have in mind that they didn't need to know what genes ultimately are, not that they didn't need a working conception of what genes are (93). Similarly, the fact that molecular genes partially overlap only shows that there is no universal, monistic definition of the gene. It doesn't show that genes are unreal or not part of the furniture of the world. These observations only undermine a metaphysical perspective under extremely strong assumptions about what a metaphysical understanding of scientific concepts would have to be like -- i.e., monistic, and based on a finished state of knowledge. It is only against these background assumptions that I can think of a charitable reading of the claim that genes provide no "metaphysical" insight into the functioning and development of organisms.

Extrapolating from the practical individuation of genes and organisms, Waters rejects the project of philosophy of nature and the idea that science has a "real message" about "our place in nature" (quotes from Godfrey-Smith 2009, 3). As an alternative, he proposes a form of pragmatism in which practices of individuation are analyzed "in terms of three-place relations: between the world, ideas, and human purposes and actions" (109). As part of the methodological re-orientation proposed in the book, I find this change of analytical strategy to be salutary. Purposes and actions are sorely neglected in "priority of individuality" approaches in philosophy of science, which often take the form of detached and aimless conceptual analysis. Again, however, it is not obvious that this form of pragmatism is really incompatible with all varieties of metaphysics, such as more naturalistic strains.

A metaphysical angle on individuation practices is not just compatible with pragmatism, but it can contribute to one of the central proposals of the volume -- namely, understanding "individuation as a process" (8). The process of individuation is not merely a logical operation, nor a metaphysical relation of determination. What it positively is, however, is less clear. According to the editorial introduction, a process approach includes practices or actions such as manipulation, tracking, and producing (7). It also gives priority to the epistemic over the metaphysical senses of individuation, in line with the methodological stance of epistemic pluralism (7). The envisaged epistemic pluralism analyzes scientific concepts roughly in terms of Waters' three-place relation (see Love and Brigandt 2017 for a detailed formulation). But what would it mean to understand this three-place relation itself as a process?

The next move for the process approach is to extend its naturalistic metaphysics (9) into a naturalistic epistemology, by injecting a healthy dose of psychologism into the discussion. After all, individuation practices are psychological processes occurring in purposive, embodied, embedded, finite cognitive agents. Individuation practices can be objects of analysis not only for philosophy of science, but also for science. For example, persistent objects are tracked through time by means of psychological processes that can be (and are) studied experimentally (see, e.g., Scholl 2007). These studies can reveal the cognitive mechanisms that underlie our concepts and intuitions about individuality, which inevitably get built into the workings of science. Although studies of this kind have not been taken up in the philosophy of science literature on individuation, they hold the promise of sorting out questions of priority in a way that is not based merely on a priori reasoning. Most significantly, a psychological perspective can re-cast the terms of Waters' three-place relation as explananda of psychological processes. This is especially desirable given that purposes, or epistemic aims, tend to acquire an ultimate status as unexplained explainers in the methodological framework of epistemic pluralism (DiFrisco 2019). When scientific practices of individuation are embedded within a more encompassing form of naturalistic inquiry, we might not get a grand philosophy of nature in the old style, but we certainly do get insights about "our place in nature."

The turn to scientific practice can be framed in many ways. I think it is most productive to view it as expanding the range of scientific activities and products that count as philosophically important and interesting. But there are deep issues that remain concerning the relations between practice and the more traditional focus of philosophy of science on theory, concepts, and representations. One of the primary virtues of the book is to open up new questions and clear new territory for further inquiry. This book is recommended for anyone interested in individuation problems in the sciences as well as questions of method in philosophy of science.


Thanks to Luz Christopher Seiberth for helpful comments and discussion.


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DiFrisco, J. 2019. "Interdisciplinarity, Epistemic Pluralism, and Unificationism: Review of Lidgard and Nyhart (eds.) Biological Individuality: Integrating Scientific, Philosophical, and Historical Perspectives." Studies in History and Philosophy of Biological and Biomedical Sciences 74: 40-44.

Godfrey-Smith, P. 2009. Darwinian Populations and Natural Selection. Oxford University Press.

Hull, D. L. 1992. "Individual." In: E. Fox-Keller and E. Lloyd (eds.), Keywords in evolutionary biology, Harvard University Press, 181-187.

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[1] It was, however, extensively explored in the work of the little-known 20th century French philosopher Gilbert Simondon (1995) (not referenced in the book). Based on his analysis of examples such as the formation of crystals out of supersaturated solutions, dissipative structures, and biological development and differentiation, Simondon argued that processes of individuation were metaphysically prior to individuality viewed as a finished state of becoming.