Ineffability and its Metaphysics: The Unspeakable in Art, Religion, and Philosophy

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Silvia Jonas, Ineffability and its Metaphysics: The Unspeakable in Art, Religion, and Philosophy, Palgrave Macmillan, 2016, 226pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781137579546.

Reviewed by Keith Ward, Heythrop College, University of London


This is a very ambitious book. Silvia Jonas sets out to articulate 'a common ground for any account of the metaphysics of ineffability'. She defines the ineffable as a nonlinguistic item which it is in principle impossible to express in conceptual terms or to communicate to others by the use of language. She is particularly interested in the uses of the term 'ineffable' in religious, aesthetic, and philosophical contexts, where it seems to mark something of special importance or significance, and she aims to provide a basic account that will illuminate both these and many other sorts of talk about ineffability in literature.

The book is difficult, because it deals with many technical issues in recent analytical philosophy. But it is worth-while for the same reason, and it offers a bold substantive thesis that is well worth pondering. Jonas begins by arguing that there are four types of entity which might be called ineffable. First, there are ineffable objects or properties, like 'the Absolute' or 'the One' (as in Hegel and Plotinus). Second, there are ineffable propositions -- truths which cannot be linguistically uttered or communicated. Third, there are ineffable contents, mental states that cannot be linguistically expressed. And fourth, there is ineffable knowledge, epistemic states that are not linguistically communicable. There is clearly overlap between these, since knowledge is a mental state which seeks to express some sort of objective reality, but Jonas uses the division to allow her to consider -- and largely reject - a number of different moves in contemporary philosophy which might be thought to support claims to ineffability.

She considers ineffable objects by analysing the idea of 'the Absolute', as used for example by Hegel. She points out the at least one property is ascribed, namely absoluteness. At the same time, the Absolute is that to which all predicates are supposed to apply. But that is self-contradictory, since 'non-absoluteness' cannot apply to it. More importantly, 'absoluteness' must be some nonqualitative, nonrelational property which uniquely identifies an ineffable Absolute. Such strange properties are known in philosophy as 'haecceities' ('thisnesses') or bare particulars. She analyses these concepts, treating en route the Leibnizian principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles and the bundle theory of universals, and concludes that they lack explanatory power and cannot be individuated. Since belief in them is questionable, so is belief in an ineffable Absolute.

Jonas' discussion of ineffable propositions introduces treatments of semantic paradoxes (as in Russell), unformulable mathematical propositions (as in Gödel), 'excess propositions' (which cannot be parts of a being's thought due perhaps to limited cognitive capacities), and 'perspectival propositions' (Thomas Nagel's bat-experiences which are ineffable to humans). The treatments are scholarly and fascinating, but her conclusion is that there is no real connection between such recondite entities and the interesting sorts of ineffability that occur in art or in religion.

I think there is more to be said about perspectival propositions. Jonas argues that all perspectival facts are true from a point of view, and all points of view must be able to be accommodated in one unified world-picture, so that they cannot be strictly ineffable. However, it seems possible that sensory and intellectual mechanisms could differ so much (for instance, between humans and God) that while there may be one coherent world-picture for one possible being (e.g. God), that picture would not be accessible, and would thus be strictly ineffable, to another being (e.g. a human being).

Ineffable content is also dismissed, but only after illuminating discussions of animal perceptions and metaphorical language. While accepting that 'raw feels' are trivially ineffable, she argues that all metaphors (for example, in religion) can in principle be reduced to literal propositions, and we use them only to express content that is not yet well understood. And while 'fine-grained' shades of colour may seem ineffable, with the use of higher level sortals and demonstratives, we could learn to express them conceptually. She also insists that 'being able to discriminate' objects, we already possess concepts, and could learn to express them linguistically, so even animal perceptions are not intrinsically ineffable. Unless cows could speak, however, I confess I am not fully convinced of this.

Finally, she comes to her own view that there is ineffable knowledge. She includes intricate discussions of 'knowledge-how', Fregean basic logical knowledge, and modern arguments about whether nonrepresentational knowledge is possible. Having ruled out most of the other candidates -- especially the view that there is such a thing as perspectival knowledge which is not even in principle communicable to different sorts of beings -- she bases her account on two sorts of ineffable knowledge that have survived her criticisms. These are indexical knowledge (knowledge that I am the person who does certain things) and phenomenal knowledge (of colour, number, and, crucially, oneself).

With regard to phenomenal knowledge, she says, 'the phenomenal lives of other beings are private and essentially inaccessible'; so I do not know what it is like to experience what another being experiences. I am acquainted only with my own phenomenal 'feels'.

She then argues that in order to move from 'someone is making a mess' to 'I am making a mess' we require the postulation of a 'primitive entity', the Self. While she holds that this is not at all an odd notion, since we all make such self-ascriptions, she admits that there is 'no commitment regarding what kind of entity the Self is'. This seems to entail that there is an ineffable object, the Self, with which we are all acquainted but of which we can say or communicate nothing. Nagel's notion of perspectival facts was rejected because it posits different facts in reality, which she argues is incoherent, whereas self-acquaintance only leads us to experience a familiar fact -- our self-ascriptive knowledge -- 'in a different way'. But surely to postulate an ineffable Self is to postulate a different fact from the facts in which reductive materialists or empiricists believe (for whom the idea that there is one and the same Self to which I ascribe my experiences is an illusion).

Though she says that the Self 'is not an obscure entity', it seems to me that the Self is very obscure indeed. It is suspiciously like a 'haecceity' or 'thisness', which she has rejected as ineffable because it lacks explanatory force and cannot be individuated. It just happens to be 'my' thisness, and I feel that the postulation of such a primitive entity also lacks explanatory force and cannot be individuated in any objective way. How is acquaintance with such an entity possible? It has no phenomenal properties (I never come across my Self), and such philosophical notions as the 'multiple drafts' account of Daniel Dennett would deny that there is just one entity, however non-sensory, that could be the Self.

The Jonas account requires that there are specific, remarkable moments of Self-acquaintance. But how could I know that it was the Self with which I was acquainted? It can only be by the theoretical argument that there are no ineffable objects, and that because such knowledge is ineffable, it must be indexical, or concerned with 'locating myself in the world'. But as she admits, aesthetic and religious cases of acquaintance with the ineffable are rarely, if ever, ascribed to the Self. They are ascribed rather to my encounter with what is not-self, and that may confront oneself. She responds that such experiences are indeed interpreted in different culturally shaped ways; but does this not mean that they are misinterpreted? She says, 'self-acquaintance might be understood specifically as acquaintance with God'. There is, it seems, one sort of ineffable knowledge that can be interpreted either theistically or non-theistically, and this 'provides a common ground for any account of the metaphysics of ineffability'. But are these two interpretations equally correct? Are they both instances of the one thing, 'self-acquaintance'? If they are ineffable, how can we know if they are the same or different?

The important religious uses of ineffability do not, I think, refer to a totally ineffable object. They usually refer, for instance, to the divine essence in itself, but that essence is also manifested in relation to the universe (the divine economy) in ways that can be at least partly expressed. There are reasons, to do with the limitation of human concepts and intellectual capacities, why the divine essence cannot be expressed linguistically. But there are also reasons to think that the divine, the inner nature of which is linguistically inexpressible and incommunicable, makes itself known, however analogically, in ways that humans can partly comprehend. Jonas' discussion is fascinating and impressive and of intrinsic philosophical interest. But does it really capture the distinctive religious (or aesthetic) senses of the ineffable?

I remain convinced that ineffable knowledge entails ineffable objects, that such objects are only partly ineffable (incommunicable and linguistically inexpressible), which is why we can speak of them as 'objects', and that the object of ineffable knowledge in art and religion is rarely, if ever, some 'primitive entity' called the Self. But that is my personal reaction. The book will help any reader, as it has helped me, to consider the concept of ineffability in a more profound way, and its detailed and often quite technical discussion of much important writing in modern philosophy is very informative. Despite my own obstinate lack of conviction, this is an intriguing, important, and scholarly contribution to discussions of ineffability, using the vocabulary and methods of modern analytic philosophy.