Ineffability and Philosophy

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André Kukla, Ineffability and Philosophy, Routledge, 2005, 178pp, £65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0415339707.

Reviewed by Ben-Ami Sharfstein, Tel-Aviv University


Ineffability and Philosophy is a short book that explains the author's views on ineffability in the light of a critical review of recent Anglo-American philosophy. Recent philosophers who wrote in languages other than English are not considered--there is nothing on Heidegger or those influenced by him, and only brief mentions, derived from secondary sources, to Eastern mysticism, mentions that show no awareness of the detailed arguments of the more philosophical Eastern mystics. Granted such limitations, which are implicit rather than explicit, Ineffability and Philosophy gives a readable, critical, relatively detailed review of what has been recently written on ineffability. As one would expect of a contentious subject, only some of Kukla's arguments are or are supposed to be quite conclusive, but they are always put in an even, rational tone, without any of the rhetorical embellishments to which the subject might have tempted him. The book concludes that there are conceptually possible types of ineffability or mysticism. That is, the weaker, less stringent claims for mysticism can be demonstrated to be coherent--"weak ineffability relative to natural languages is both coherent and verifiable"--while the stronger, more stringent ones have not been demonstrated to be incoherent--"the absence of refutations provides us with the grounds for a weak presumption that ineffable insights of all grades are a coherent possibility."

To get to this point, the author has to refute well-known arguments propounded by Donald Davidson and William Alston. The obvious question that follows is that, granted the logical possibility of mystic states, do they actually exist? The author replies that there are two, opposite kinds of arguments for mysticism, the one kind based on the extraordinary capacities of at least some exceptional human minds, and the other, on the unavoidable limitations, the epistemic boundedness, of human minds. He concludes that, together, these two kinds of argument support at least some of the less far-reaching forms of the claim for ineffability, and that some of the other, stronger forms of ineffability can in principle be empirically resolved by those who learn by their actual experience to accept or repudiate the ability claimed by mystics. "I conclude," says Kukla, that the evidence both for and against accrediting the mystic is very weak," but that, more importantly, "there are possible data that could settle the issue."

Ineffability and Philosophy is divided into four main parts, which are: Ineffability: The Very Idea; Mysticism, Epistemic Boundedness and Ineffability; Believing the Mystic; and Five Types of Ineffability. Kukla opens the first of these chapters by pointing out that, apart from religion, there has been a group of influential but heterodox mathematicians, including Cantor, Bolzano, Dedekind, A. W. Moore, and Rudy Rucker, who argue in favor of mathematical ineffability, and that such contemporary cognitive scientists as Fodor, Chomsky, and McGinn have held, in Fodor's term, that human minds are "epistemically bounded," meaning that there are some hypotheses that they are incapable of entertaining. In any case, "the idea that there is an ineffable being, or truth, or experience, and that this ineffability profoundly matters to our assessment of the human condition" is identified with mysticism and leads to the claim, in both mathematics and religion, that "the attempt to express the ineffable must systematically embroil us in contradictory assertions."

Kukla approaches the problem of ineffability from, as he says, the standpoint of Tarski, in the attempt to see if it is able to accommodate the idea of a state of affairs that cannot be expressed in any language that is humanly accessible. He works his way through one criticism after another of the Tarskian approach to language, finds that none of them is fatal, and reaches the conclusion that, if he will succeed in making the case for ineffability in the Tarskian context, he will have shown that "scientific discourse does not rule out the possibility of ineffable experience."

The final chapter of Ineffability and Philosophy again takes up the types of ineffability. The weak grade of ineffability is exemplified by the inadequacy of the language of a young child to express much of what adults say, or of the inadequacy of the language of the blind to represent colors. It is also exemplified by the claim of the anthropologist Benjamin Lee Whorf that the Hopi language is devoid of tenses. To add some detail to Kukla's text on Whorf: unlike speakers of the Indo-European languages, says Whorf, the Hopi do not objectify temporal processes, whether past, present or future, or summer or year or month. Instead, they speak of the future, for example, in terms of expectation, and use an adverbial phrase to say "while morning is occurring," or, instead of "this winter," "winter recently." To the extent that Whorf's ideas are right (in their extreme form, they have been successfully refuted), much in Hopi cannot be adequately translated into English, and although Whorf does not say so because he takes Hopi in this respect to be superior to English and similar languages, the reverse should also be true.

The claim that there are facts or experiences inexpressible in any language is a claim for a higher grade of ineffability. It is hard, however, to conceptualize such a fact or sentence because even when the whole of a truth cannot be expressed, some part or other of it might be expressible in some language or other, or (an even more difficult instance to exemplify) in some logically possible more-than-human mind. On balance, however, "it's currently rational to believe in the actual occurrence of weak human ineffabilities. By contrast, nomological and higher ineffabilities are merely speculative possibilities. But it's not crazy to entertain them."

It is certainly not a criticism of Kukla that after all his careful reasoning, with its various grades and types of ineffability, he comes to two conclusions that are the same as those many persons hold intuitively. The first is that the individual's linguistic resources, or those of a particular language, or even those of language in general may prove inadequate. The second conclusion, which is that of common sense, is that the attitude of an attentive observer to the claims of a mystic to possess superior, more-than-rational knowledge is subject to the observer's experience of the mystic's abilities and instructions. In other words, a reasonable person would agree that there may be empirical evidence that strengthens or weakens the mystic's claim to possess potent ineffable knowledge. This view is related to the work of the psychologists whose observations of the effects of meditation on a mystic's frame of mind and personality provide empirical data relevant to the usual mystical claims.

Although Kukla's arguments are reasonable and often persuasive, the possibility of rejecting them is, of course, always open. But since I do not think it would be especially helpful to criticize them, I should like to make what seems to me more useful criticisms in the light of larger issues that he either makes too little of or neglects. There is a range of evidence that would have made some difference, if not in his conclusions, at least in the experiential awareness in the light of which he reaches them.[1] Take, for instance, the inability to express the experience of color that he ascribes to the blind (from birth). Yet there are blind persons who by virtue of a keen memory, non-visual sensory cues, and the associations of words and images are able to speak with astonishing linguistic adequacy about sight and color, if they learn to intuit or code the relation of a given color with the notion of color in general. Such a person can achieve a sense of color or other visual experience that is perhaps closer to that of the seeing than the scientist's of a particle known only by means of the combination of elaborate theories and complex instruments. Challenged to define the word "dazzle," a blind man says that it means "to brighten, to make it so bright that you can't see for a second, something sudden…like turning on a bright light in a dark room. But also isn't it more like shimmering glowing? Like you think of it with jewels."[2]

It is particularly easy for us to forget that words, having acquired their power and usefulness by their abstractness, which is their ability to refer to anything in terms of the kind of experience or thing it is, are generally inadequate for the full expression or description of any experience at all. In this sense, their inadequacy to express quite ordinary experiences seems to me no different than their inadequacy to express what is considered to be a mystical experience. They are or appear to be adequate only to the extent that they refer to what speaker and auditor assume is the same object or experience. If everyone had a presumably similar mystical experience, the use of the words "mystical experience" would be accurate and the experience itself effable, as accurate and effable as the words "I'm eating an orange" to anyone who had eaten oranges. And just as the words, "I'm eating a mango" mean little to someone who has never eaten one, and who is reduced to imagining what this is like by the comparison, made by someone else who has in fact eaten one, with other fruits, textures, and flavors, so the words "mystical experience" and their various synonyms in different traditions mean little to anyone who has not undergone such an experience and must depend on a series of evidently inadequate comparisons. In other words, for any unshared experience, mystical or not, partial ineffability is the rule, not the exception.

Because the length of this review does not allow me to pursue such themes--not even the comparison of "scientific discourse" with poetry--I turn to the confinement of Kukla's book to present-day Anglo-American philosophy. As defensible as this may seem to us as contemporary Anglo-Americans, it matters because it represents what, to put it baldly, is a kind of implicit assumption that this represents the sum and substance of what does and should interest a contemporary philosopher. In relation to subjects such as ineffability and mysticism, the assumption is mistaken, not only because contemporary non-English philosophy has been omitted, along with old, still viable points-of-view, but also because our contemporary concern with the philosophical analysis of ineffability and mysticism is exceeded, I think, in variety and intensity by those of India, China, and Japan.

Kukla refers to the problem of ineffability of God or God's attributes, but does not refer directly to the Neo-Platonic reasoning that reaches from Plotinus and Proclus to Leibniz, Spinoza, Hegel, and beyond, and rests on various forms of the ontological argument for the existence of the One, the absolute Good, absolute Perfection, or God, and in one of its forms answers the question, as Leibniz put it, "Why is there anything at all?"[3] But since these philosophers and their arguments for God's existence and its effability by way of weak analogies are familiar to us in the West (as they are in the furtive near-hints of reality that Derrida allows), I confine myself to a few words on the Buddhist philosopher Nagarjuna (fl. c. 200 CE) and the Hindu philosopher Shrihasha (fl. 1150 CE).[4]

More radically than Kukla, who accepts the claim that the idea of an indescribable God or mystical experience is incoherent, Nagarjuna argues that everything humans put into words is incoherent, including what is said of Buddha and nirvana. Everything is, so to speak, "empty," has no ontologically definite existence. Or, it has a kind of existence that neither logic can formulate nor that language can put into consistent, meaningful words. Therefore the most reasonable use to which reason can be put is the analysis of its own inadequacy. Such a view of things is still alive in Zen thought, as it is in the contemporary Kyoto school of philosophy.

Shriharsha, a believer in the ineffable Brahman as the only real existent, attacks his philosophical opponent's belief in the world of real, independent things that are known by reliable perception and tested inference and shows that his opponent is quite unable to maintain the standards of evidence and reasoning the realist opponent himself considers essential. The realist's definition of his essential concepts are all either too broad or too narrow, or suffer from circularity, infinite regress, or incompatibility with other essential concepts, and so turn out to be useless for their declared purposes. Shriharsha goes through the whole lexicon of his opponent's concepts and in each case asks and fails to get a satisfactory answer to the questions "How do you define?" and "What is meant by?" For example, the opponent fails to give a satisfactory definition of the concept "cause," and when the opponent tries to define this concept with the help of the concepts "before, "after," and "time," Shriharsha asks what exactly he means by each and is dissatisfied with the answer. To the protest that Shriharsha has only shown that the exact nature of time is doubtful, he answers, "You cannot explain the exact nature of doubt, either." To him, everything in the phenomenal world is indefinable, including indefinability. By denying philosophers of the realistic, rational kind the use of their concepts, he has, he believes, proved the insufficiency of language in general, and of rational explanation in particular. But then, to explain why there is anything at all, we have no choice but to turn to the rationally indescribable Brahman. According to Shriharsha, even the opponent's question of how the existence of Brahman could be proved shows that the opponent already has a notion of something the idea of which is impossible to refute, that which is and explains why there is (verbally indescribable) existence at all.

Common sense might well reject the Buddhist and Hindu arguments I have given in favor of mysticism and its attendant ineffability, but common sense has perhaps equal difficulties with the current scientific explanation of the existence of the universe as the result of a random fluctuation of a virtual particle in "empty" space. It is clear that modern intellectually inclined mystics, like the ancient ones, have access to arguments that, in capable hands, can become abstractly powerful. Ineffability and Philosophy does not recognize them or their potential power adequately. Within its declared limits, it is a good, useful book; but these limits are too narrow.

[1] See B.-A. Scharfstein, Ineffability: The Failure of Words in Philosophy and Religion, Albany, State University of New York Press, 1993, esp. chap. 1. Kukla does not mention this book.

[2] B. Landau and L. R. Gleitman, Language and Experience, Cambridge, Harvard University Press, pp. 95-96.

[3] See, e.g., D. Blumenthal, "Leibniz's Ontological and Cosmological Arguments," in N. Jolley, The Cambridge Companion to Leibniz, Cambridge, Cambridge University Press, 1995, pp. 3553-381.

[4] For these two philosophers, see B.-A. Scharfstein, A Comparative History of World Philosophy: From the Upanishads to Kant, State University of New York Press, Albany, 1998, chap. 8.