Inference and Consciousness

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Anders Nes and Timothy Chan (eds.), Inference and Consciousness, Routledge, 2020, 294pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138557178.

Reviewed by Christopher Mole, University of British Columbia


Psychologists who ventured into the territory of their philosophical neighbours thirty years ago were often looking for ideas about consciousness, but they were also interested in reasoning and the representation of thought. Those interests gave the impetus to questions about the purportedly analogue format of mental imagery (Kosslyn; Sterelny; Rollins); to questions about the apparent need for inference to be conducted in a language of thought (Fodor; Fodor and Pylyshyn); and to questions about the putative roles for 'heuristics' (Tversky and Kahneman; Gigerenzer), and for 'mental models' (Johnson-Laird), in supporting reasoning. Themes from that twentieth-century work make a number of appearances in this volume of new essays, edited by Anders Nes with his whilom colleague Timothy Chan.

The book's eleven chapters contribute to a succession of different projects. Some attempt to understand the epistemic status of sophisticated inferential phenomena, as when Corine Besson discusses the grounds for our entitlements to use, and to believe in, some basic principles of logic; and as also when Ram Neta attempts to account for a route by which beliefs can be rationally self-attributed. Other chapters address questions about the contents of perception -- as in Elijah Chudnoff's discussion of an argument from Susanna Siegel's work on the rationality of perception, and as also in Berit Brogaard's argument for the claim that semantic properties can be among the perceived properties of words. Yet others are concerned with phenomenology, as in Nes's own contribution, which addresses the ways in which attitudes can contribute to the rationality of an inference without occupying the foreground of consciousness.

Since there is no one target at which all the volume's authors are aiming, it need not be a problem that their conceptions of inference differ. Some take inference to be a process, perhaps conscious or perhaps unconscious, over the course of which a representation of one set of propositions gets transferred into a representation of some logically-related set. Others take inference to be the accomplishment of a conscious subject who understands premises and conclusion to stand in some logical relationship. The difference is not only in the role that consciousness is taken to play. It is also in the metaphysical category -- 'process' or 'accomplishment' -- to which inference is said to belong (see Mourelatos, for an account of the contrast). A consequence of these differing conceptions is that, although there are real disagreements between the various contributors, their chapters do not line up on opposite sides of any one clear debate. Some of their more fundamental disagreements are buried beneath corollaries, and some of their most conspicuous disagreements are less profound than they appear.

The volume begins, after a summarizing introduction, with three chapters on unconscious inference. In the first Kirk Ludwig and Wade Munroe argue against the idea that subpersonal systems can infer. Their arguments recall those offered in a Wittgensteinian spirit by Max Bennett and P.M.S. Hacker. They turn, in Ludwig and Munroe's handling, on the idea that inference must be distinguished from the merely sequential tokening of attitudes, with the difference requiring that the subject of an inference be involved, as agent, in the act of taking of an inferential step. Subpersonal inferences would therefore require subpersonal systems to be capable of performing acts. And in this way the notion of subpersonal inference can be made to seem problematic, since the performance of acts is plausibly taken to be a phenomenon that is proprietary to the personal level.

Ludwig and Munroe are aware that one might respond to this argument by allowing that subpersonal inferences are not inferences proper, but are instead inference-like computations. They have no objection to theories that postulate such computations -- although one suspects that they don't often meet examples of this that they like -- but they suggest that such theories retain their claim to being a version of realism about subpersonal inference only if they maintain that the states participating in these inference-like computations are representations, and not merely information-carriers. After pointing to some difficulties faced by attempts to account for this representational status, they conclude that theories postulating subpersonal-inferences should be regarded as serving at best a heuristic function, as waystations on the route to some theory that has been framed in terms from which the personal-level connotations have been more thoroughly removed.

In the next chapter, Michael Rescorla displays an opposing set of sympathies, while nonetheless occupying a position that disagrees with Ludwig and Munroe less fundamentally than one might expect. Their differences of approach are real enough: Whereas Ludwig and Munroe are opposed to the postulation of subpersonal inferences, the Bayesianism advocated by Rescorla is committed to such inferences happening all of the time. It claims that some notable proportion of these inferences -- although Rescorla insists (p. 46) that the proportion need not be a majority -- have the form of a conditionalization, in which the probability assigned to a hypothesis is updated in the light of incoming evidence, while taking account of the prior probably of that hypothesis, and of that evidence.

Rescorla applies scientific realism's usual strategies to make his case for being a realist about the existence of these subpersonal Bayesian inferences, noting the explanatory advantages of theories that postulate them. These advantages are most clearly on display in the explanation of visual phenomena, which Rescorla emphasizes, where Bayesian theories fit an impressive range of data. He overstates the magnitude of these advantages when he writes:

Instrumentalism about Bayesian cognitive science is no more plausible than instrumentalism regarding physics, chemistry, biology, or any other successful science. Just as the explanatory success of physics provides evidence for gravity, or the explanatory success of chemistry provides evidence for the chemical bond . . . so does the explanatory success of Bayesian cognitive science provides evidence for credal states and transitions across a range of psychological domains. (p. 57)

Even the most ardently Bayesian cognitive scientists should admit that their theory's accomplishments are not yet on a par with those that can be claimed for the theory of chemical bonds, or of gravity. But the claims that Rescorla takes to be Bayesianism's most central commitments need no such grandiose support. He suggests that the most ambitious characterizations of Bayesianism are strawmen, and that actual Bayesians merely "regard idealized Bayesian modelling as a good starting point for constructing . . . explanations [of 'mental and behavioural outcomes']" (p. 45). This is a Bayesianism that merely gives advice as to a sensible starting point. Its commitments are "methodological rather than doctrinal", and so are akin to the commitments of a Kuhnian paradigm (p. 53).

Since this version of Bayesianism commits us to a starting point, and not to a terminus, it can be endorsed while stopping short of believing in the existence of the entities that are postulated at the current stage of theoretical development. Rescorla himself says that the models provided by Bayesians should be understood as belonging to a phase of enquiry at which it is legitimate to "incorporate idealizing assumptions known to be false or even impossible" (p. 58), in the hope that more accurate theories will be developed subsequently. One might agree with these claims while also agreeing with Ludwig and Munroe, when they say that cognitive science's postulation of subpersonal inferences is best understood as a heuristic measure, to be replaced at a later stage of enquiry by a theory in which talk about inferences has been replaced by talk about computations with an inference-like form. The difference between these first chapters therefore turns out to be less substantive than one might suppose.

Bayesianism continues to be a theme in the chapter by Federico Bongiorno and Lisa Bortolotti in which they follow Max Coltheart in adopting a Bayesian perspective on debates concerning the etiology of the Capgras delusion. Their claim is not that Bayesianism has a solution to these debates, just that it yields a distinctive account of the points of disagreement between some of the theories that have been proposed in the course of them. These debates centre on the relationship between a Capgras patient's delusive belief that his wife has been replaced by an imposter and the patient's experiences when looking at his wife. There is some evidence indicating that these experiences might lack their usual emotional colouring (since they do not elicit a normal autonomic response). Different theories give differing accounts of the route that takes a delusional patient from this experiential abnormality to a doxastic one, with some taking the route to involve further abnormalities, and others not.

These debates have proven to be a useful forum in which to explicate different conceptions of belief formation, and of the relationship between cognition and perception. Bayesianism has a distinctive perspective on these matters, and so there is interest in seeing how it performs in this forum. The interest does not depend on its performance enabling it to account for new bodies of clinical data, or having immediate therapeutic implications. It would nonetheless be regrettable if philosophers were to disregard the need to address delusion's clinical aspects. Habits of thought that we have acquired in the contemplation of thought-experiments may serve us well when considering cases such as blindsight -- which is a rare quirk, conveying a surprising ability on those who have it -- but may serve us less well when considering cases of monothematic delusion, which make a real contribution to human distress. It is important here that the neatness of philosophical theories be tested against the complexity of clinical reality. There are, as yet, relatively few points at which theory and data come into contact.

Part II is concerned with the role of inference in the comprehension of language. Brogaard's chapter takes inference as Ludwig and Munroe do, as a phenomenon found only at the personal level. She presents a range of evidence suggesting that, on this understanding, the meanings of linguistic stimuli are often perceived, rather than being inferred. This evidence is convincing insofar as it supports a claim about the perception of individual word-meanings. It is somewhat thinner where it concerns the perception of syntactically-complex utterance-meanings, but here too Brogaard's claim has a prima facie plausibility that enjoys some empirical corroboration. She concludes by noting that its arguments leave important business for another day, establishing at most that some meanings can be registered by processes that involve no personal-level acts of inference-drawing, but not yet showing that meanings can be detected in ways that make no use of 'system-one' type processing, and therefore stopping short of the larger claim that she has in her sights, which is that semantic properties can be registered by some purely perceptual system, without the involvement (at run-time) of anything cognitive.

The points playing a peripheral role for Brogaard play a more central role for Nicholas Allott. He makes a case for claiming that some of the processes by which we comprehend sentence- and narrative-level meanings have their progress monitored as they go along, in a way that contributes to their speed and outcome. Allott suggests that these monitoring processes be understood as instances of 'procedural metacognition', in the sense introduced by Joëlle Proust. His claims need not conflict with the equally plausible claims presented by Brogaard, although here, as in Part I, there is an evident difference in the authors' sympathies.

Allott's argument proceeds by an inference to the best explanation of a combined body of empirical and theoretical data. The conclusion of any such inference must here be tentative, since we are in a domain where no very complete explanations are available. The fourth section of Allott's discussion might perhaps have been more scrupulously tentative, especially where it considers an example involving the interpretation of anaphoric pronouns. Allott convincingly illustrates the inadequacy of a 'spreading activation' model (which would involve no metacognitive processing). This would support his metacognitive view if the spreading activation model were its only rival, but the literature here is rich with alternatives.

Without consideration of these alternatives, Allott's chapter might give the impression that the disambiguation of pronouns has been discussed largely by philosophers, whereas it is a topic of ongoing research in psycholinguistics (Taylor, Stowe, Redeker and Hoeks), and is, in the guise of the 'Winograd schemas', a source of the most notorious difficulties faced by computer scientists working on natural language processing (Winograd; Ruan et al.). An abductive argument for Allott's proposal might try to show that the computational approaches employing procedural metacognition have the best chances of eventual success, but an argument along these lines would need to pay close attention to the details of recent computational proposals. Even if the details of these algorithms were taken into account, such an argument would still need to be tentative, since no model can yet claim successes that approach human levels of performance.

Jake Quilty-Dunn and Eric Mandelbaum address 'non-inferential transitions', expanding on the 2018 paper in which they considered inferential ones. Their declared aim is to give a "short (and surely incomplete) taxonomy of types of mental transitions" (p. 152). This, in the absence of a principle for the individuation of taxa, is a pretext for saying some things. The things said are important for a number of philosophical and psychological purposes. They follow lines that were laid down in the 1990s, at the time when connectionist modelling challenged the language of thought hypothesis's claim to be the only game in town. Quilty-Dunn and Mandelbaum's main arguments recall those that were marshalled in defence of the Language of Thought hypothesis (e.g., Davies), showing that the rational handling of representations is harder to explain if these representations lack a syntactic structure that corresponds to the logical form of the proposition represented. Explanations that avoid such structure are sometimes available, but tend to be domain-specific (and so stop short as explanations for the systematicity of thought), although this, as Quilty-Dunn and Mandelbaum make clear, does not mean that they find no application.

If one thinks of syntactically-structured representations as akin to well-formed formulae of a logical calculus, and if one thinks of unstructured representations as akin to photographs, then hybrid representations will seem chimeric. Quilty-Dunn and Mandelbaum consider hybrids only briefly, acknowledging the possibility that "iconic-discursive hybrids like maps could figure in transitions in virtue of rules that specify their constituent structures, and thus count as genuine inferences despite lacking logical operators" (p. 159). There are other hybrid cases that might also have been considered. The representations generated in the most promising of the current machine learning systems turn out, unlike those generated by their simpler connectionist forebears, to exhibit something that is rather like syntactic structure (Bowers). There are open questions about the sufficiency of such structure as a medium for inference (Schlegel, Neubert and Protzel). There are also questions about the degree of syntactic articulation that is required for purely Bayesian inference: In some such inferences there is no obvious need to explicitly represent very much of the internal logical structure of the hypotheses to which probabilities are assigned. It is to be hoped that Quilty-Dunn and Mandelbaum will address some of these questions in future parts of what is evidently an ongoing project.

Readers with more purely epistemological tastes will find the volume's highlights in Besson's chapter, where she addresses the question of how knowledge of logical principles might be acquired without the principles being presupposed. Here, as elsewhere in the epistemology of logic, care must be taken to avoid begging the question. The taking of this care is not conducive to the writing of breezy and approachable prose, but Besson succeeds in showing the appeal of the path that she recommends taking, through what has often seemed to be impassable territory. It begins by noting that, in a system of natural deduction, each line must be licenced by some rule, but there is no line of the proof in which that rule is shown to be applicable: The prover's recognition of each step as an instance of some rule happens off stage. Besson's first suggestion is that rational inferences can have a similar feature: The thinker's taking of an inferential step can be licenced by his recognition of a logical relation, without this recognition itself being a piece of inference. Besson then proposes that this recognition of the logical relationship that licences an inferential step need not be a recognition of the step's conformity to any general rule. It can instead be the recognition of some single particular entailment. The knowledge created by several instances of such recognition can then put thinkers in a position where they are justified in adopting the general rule that grounds the validity of these several individually-recognized inferences.

The last of these steps is the one about which Besson has the least to say, although she follows Graham Priest in suggesting that it might be thought of as a 'low-level theoretical generalization formed by some kind of induction', adding that it might also involve inference to the best explanation. Some readers will dislike the idea that inductive or abductive inferences play a role in our adoption of deductive principles, but Besson's proposal is less an attempt to put deductive reasoning on informal foundations, and more an attempt to build all of reasoning on foundations that are given by a suitably sophisticated epistemology of perception: her account is one in which our epistemic entitlements are derived from quasi-perceptual acts of apprehension, which are not merely encounters with the world, but which also involve recognition of the things and patterns that are instantiated in that world. She characterizes her picture as one in which 'rational insight provides justification for directly apprehended individual substitution instances in the vernacular as a ground for apprehension of general patterns of inference' (p. 190).

The chapters by Nes, and by David Henderson, Terry Horgan, and Matjaž Potrč, also make use of an analogy between instances of reasoning that are not instances of deduction, and instances of perception that are not instances of simply seeing that P. Both are concerned with the forms of thinking that draw on information to which the thinker pays no attention, as, for example, when our presuppositions play an unnoticed role in our interpretation of utterances, and as when our background theories play a role in the formation of our plans. It has long been clear that a very large body of information makes such a tacit contribution to our thinking, and that our failures to artificially model intelligence are the result, in part, of our failure to understand this contribution. Daniel Dennett and Jerry Fodor discussed such failures in some memorable works from which Henderson, Horgan and Potrč quote extensively, before going on to present an analogy that has been central to several of the papers they have variously co-authored, according to which unentertained information plays a role in thought that is similar to the role of unseen light-sources in vision. Just as visual processing delivers an experience that takes account of the colour of unseen light sources, so (these authors suggest) does inference deliver beliefs and plans that take account of information that is not consciously entertained. Nes adds phenomenological nuance to this picture, suggesting that the gist of our background information can make an appearance in the unattended background of consciousness. His elaboration of this proposal involves a close reading of some philosophical and psychological theories of inattentive consciousness, and of some ongoing controversies as to the sorts of content (if any) that can figure in it.

The final two chapters return to more purely epistemological matters. Chudnoff takes issue with Siegel's claim (2017) that false beliefs can contribute to experiences in ways that rob those experiences of their justificatory force . He does this by scrutinizing one of Siegel's examples with a closeness that may appear laboured. His introductory sections do little to mitigate this appearance. With their nine subtly-different named theses, they seem to delight in their own scholasticism. But Siegel's examples play a sufficiently central role in the current literature that their details are worth considering. Chudnoff's examination of them focusses on the case of Jill experiencing the emotionally-neutral features of Jack's face while also having an experience (owing to her false belief) of that face as expressing anger. Siegel takes the second of these experiences to lack justificatory force, on account of the false belief that contributes to it. Chudnoff takes it to have prima facie justificatory force that is cancelled by the experience's first part. His discussion is largely an attempt to establish that the first part of this experience must be present, and able to play such a justification-cancelling role.

Although Chudnoff's treatment of the case is plausible, his line of attack could be blocked if Siegel were to insist that the example's details are other than those that he fills in. It is enough for her if there can be a case in which Jill sees Jack's face as angry but fails (unlike in the case that Chudnoff imagines) to see any features of Jack's face that would contradict this experience. Chudnoff purports to find such a version of Siegel's case inconceivable, suggesting that it would be as strange as seeing a shape as octagonal while failing to see its sides, but this, in the context of the present debate, is tendentious. Siegel would not accept any general principle saying that experiences presenting high-level properties must also present their lower-level realizers. One can, for example, experience the ill-formedness of a sentence, without knowing anything about the grammatical structure that gives it this appearance. There is therefore nothing to prevent Siegel from stipulating that her case is one in which Jill experiences Jack's face as angry without knowing anything about the physiognomy that gives it this appearance. Chudnoff's alternative account of the example's epistemology would then be unavailable.

In the final chapter Neta considers a puzzle that originates in Gareth Evans's observation that the question of whether one believes that P can sometimes be answered by considering the evidence that P, as when I ask whether you think that it is going to rain, and you look to the clouds and say that it is, but don't -- unless you are being obtuse -- introspect on your meterological convictions, despite the fact that my question was about your beliefs, and not primarily about the weather.

Rather than being puzzled by this one might instead say that, although my question was not literally about the weather, it was weather that I would naturally be understood to have been asking about in any normal context where this question was uttered. The question invites you to make an assertion about your beliefs, and not about the weather directly, because I do not take you to be in a knowledgeable position about such paradigmatically unpredictable phenomenon, and a direct question would implicate that I did take you to be in such a position, given the knowledge-norm of assertion. Neta is dismissive of such implicature-based accounts of Evans's phenomenon. He rushes past them to get to his more sophisticated criticisms of the proposals made by Richard Moran and by Alex Byrne, to which his own proposal is more closely related. But the grounds for dismissal assume that any theory that takes the inquirer to be asking primarily about the weather must take their question (which is literally about beliefs) to be idiomatic. Neta thinks that such theories can therefore be refuted by showing that the phenomenon under investigation is not a quirk of English (p. 278). This is a mistake: implicatures can be generated by general features of conversation, independent of the language in which the conversation is taking place.

The mistake undermines some of the preliminary motivation for Neta's positive proposal. His more sophisticated motivations are also less secure than the chapter suggests, depending as they do on his assertion that Evans's phenomenon is found "just as plausibly in cases where I ask why you think it is going to rain, and not whether you think it is" (p. 282). This is not obviously so. Adapting Evans' example in the way that Neta suggests would, to my ear, remove much of its naturalness. A dialogue like Evans's seems perfectly natural:

A: "Do you think it is going to rain?"

B: (looking at the clouds) "Yes"

Neta's variation on it seems less so:

A: "Why do you think it is going to rain?"

B: (looking at the clouds) "The sky is darkening."

I invite the reader to try each of these questions on an unprimed speaker of English. I hypothesize that the first will seem more normal than the second. To make the second question seem natural it is necessary to interpret it as saying: "Why, do you think, is it going to rain?". But on this reading the question can be construed literally as a request for your not-necessarily knowledgeable perspective on the rain's causes. This points again to a role for the knowledge norm in the explanation of this phenomenon, and so it points to an explanation that is given by a theory of conversational practice, and not, as Neta would have it, by a theory of a posteriori first-person epistemology.

With face-to-face research currently in abeyance owing to pandemic-containment measures, it seems likely that some researchers in the sciences of mind will be considering their disciplines' theoretical foundations, and so looking again at the work of their philosophical neighbours. This book belongs to an area of enquiry that was once a busy site of such interdisciplinary exchange. Should any of these neighbouring researchers buy this expensive book, they will find it to contain a wide variety of arguments, many of which make genuine contributions to our best-informed enquiries into the explanation of thought. Those arguments are expressed in philosophy's peculiar idiom, and with rather a large number of typographical errors (some of which may be a real impediment to understanding: the captions of the figures on p. 265 are switched, and say the opposite of what they should, while the caption for the figure on p. 113 says 'green' when it means 'red'). These off-putting features are superficial. It is to be hoped that they do not prevent the ideas in this book from being seen in the several different interdisciplinary contexts that give them their full significance.


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