Inferentialism: Why Rules Matter

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Jaroslav Peregrin, Inferentialism: Why Rules Matter, Palgrave Macmillan, 2014, 277pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781137452955.

Reviewed by Chauncey Maher, Dickinson College


'Regel' means rule, but it didn't have to mean that, or anything at all. According to inferentialism, 'Regel' and other words of natural languages have meanings because they have inferential roles; they have the specific meanings they do because they have the specific inferential roles they do. Jaroslav Peregrin articulates and defends a version of that idea, stressing (in Part I) the importance of rules, and highlighting (in Part II) how the idea applies to logical vocabulary and laws of logic. Inferentialism is a clear and helpful presentation of its namesake theory. It is a welcome complement to Robert Brandom's Articulating Reasons, an abbreviated form of his Making It Explicit, which are currently the most prominent and influential statements of inferentialism. Both of Brandom's books cover a lot of philosophical terrain (language, mind, knowledge, action, and logic). Peregrin's book, by contrast, covers less terrain, primarily language and logic. That allows him to explore topics that Brandom does not explore in much detail in either of his books, especially aspects of inferentialism about logic. While Peregrin and Brandom agree about many important points, Inferentialism offers readers something new.

Let me first briefly summarize each chapter, and then I will indicate a few ways in which the book could have addressed some important topics more thoroughly.

In Chapter One, Peregrin argues for normative inferentialism over causal inferentialism. Causal inferentialism holds that the meaning of a word (e.g., 'Regel') is constituted by the inferences that people make or are disposed to make involving that word. Normative inferentialism, by contrast, holds that the meaning of a word is constituted by rules or norms governing inferences that speakers might make involving that word. Unlike its causal sibling, the explanans is good or proper inference (hence norms of inference), not just inference of any sort.

In Chapter Two, Peregrin contends that normative inferentialism must broaden the notion of a rule of inference in two ways. First, it must admit some "material" rules of inference, ones that hold not in virtue of their so-called logical form but in virtue of the non-logical terms they involve, such as a rule licensing the inference from 'This is a mammal' to 'This is an animal.' Without such rules, no account of the meaning of non-logical terms -- 'mammal', 'animal', 'quark' and 'justice' -- could be given, since there would be no way to distinguish between such terms. Second, inferentialism must also admit rules for transitions from observable circumstances to sentences. Otherwise, it cannot adequately account for the meanings of empirical terms, such as 'mammal,' and 'animal,' terms which are distinguished partly by being properly used in response to relevant, observable circumstances. Following Brandom, Peregrin calls the resulting idea "Strong Inferentialism."

In Chapter Three, Peregrin gets formally precise about inferential roles. A sentence's inferential potential is the set of sentences that it may be validly inferred from, and the set of sentences that may be validly inferred from it. What conclusions I may draw from a given sentence depend also on collateral premises available to me. I may not infer 'This is a square' from 'This has four right angles' alone, but I may do so with the addition of 'This has four equal sides'. A sentence's inferential significance is a sentence's inferential potential in a given context. A word's meaning is its contribution to the inferential potentials of sentences in which it occurs. This implies, according to Peregrin, that compositionality -- the idea that the meaning of a sentence depends in some way on the meanings of its constituent parts -- lies at the heart of inferentialism. In his words, "the inferential potential of every complex sentence can be seen as the sum of the contributions of its parts" (52).

In Chapter Four, Peregrin aims to explain what it is for there to be rules governing inference. He says that for there to be a rule -- e.g., A implies B -- there must be normative attitudes, especially corrective attitudes towards those who violate the rule by, say, asserting A and denying B. Normative attitudes of this sort include explicit expressions of rules. Since he thinks that meaning-claims (e.g., '"Regel" means rule') express rules, he thinks they have normative force. In this respect, he thinks that meaning is normative. He explains that meaning-claims are nevertheless not rules for action -- rules for what to say when -- but only rules for criticism -- rules for which acts may be criticized or accepted. Just as the rules of chess do not tell you which move to make at any given point in a game, but only frame the space of possible moves, so too rules of inference do not tell you which inferences to make in a conversation, but only frame the space of possible inferences.

In Chapter Five, Peregrin develops this idea further, carefully discussing the limits of the worn analogy between language and games, such as chess. He provides a very instructive table arraying important similarities. But there are many important differences. Unlike chess, some rules of language must, on pain of regress, remain unarticulated. The rules of language are also more complex, intricate, and disordered than those of chess. The rules of chess place only minimal constraints on how the game is implemented or embodied, but language imposes important "regulations" on the equipment involved: sign-designs, those who use them, and the many other things with which they interact and about which they speak. Perhaps most importantly, in chess, there is no counterpart to the world, which seems essential to natural language as we know it. Peregrin suggests language is more like a version of chess in which worldly conditions are given a role, such as making it impermissible to move a pawn when it's raining (34).[1]

In Chapter Six, Peregrin considers how rules of any sort might have evolved. The main challenge, he thinks, is to explain why organisms would go from acting with regularity to following rules. Why would rules and rule-following have been evolutionarily advantageous? He conjectures that "rule-based cooperation" could have helped reduce "free riding," i.e., benefitting from other creatures' performance of a behavior but not performing that behavior oneself. Like Sellars, Brandom, and many others sympathetic with inferentialism, Peregrin holds that the capacity to follow rules distinguishes humans from other creatures, creating a "virtual space of meaningfulness" that didn't previously exist.

Part II and Peregrin's turn to inferentialism about logic begins in Chapter Seven. This part uses more logical notation than Part I, but Peregrin remains clear throughout it, and I think it should be accessible to anyone who is comfortable with some basic philosophy of logic. Peregrin opens with a problem for inferentialism about logic. Gödel and Tarski have shown that there is more to consequence than inference, so inference cannot be used to explain consequence, which is precisely what inferentialism about logic aspires to do. The core of the problem is that if inferability is provability from finite premises, then some consequences cannot be inferred. Peregrin proposes to broaden the notion of inference (a third time) so that it need not be something that could be performed by humans, who can use only finite premises.

In Chapter Eight, Peregrin considers which of the classical logical operators (¬, ∨, ∧, →) can be properly captured by an inferential pattern. He holds that ∨ cannot be so captured. In brief, his argument is that the introduction rules for ∨ (AAB; BAB) do not forbid a circumstance in which AB is true, but neither A nor B is true. So, there is "no straightforward inferentialist way to classical logic" (184). This need not be a problem for the inferentialist because she could dig in her heels and say so much the worse for classical logic. Or she could allow for "multiple conclusion" rules of inference, which permit one to draw multiple conclusions from a single set of premises (e.g., ABA, B). Or she could admit that from an inferentialist point of view, intuitionistic logic -- a logic without the law of excluded middle (A ∨ ¬A) -- is more "natural" than classical logic.

In Chapter Nine, Peregrin develops "expressivism" about logical vocabulary, the idea that such vocabulary makes it possible to express material rules of inference as claims in a language. He explains what sorts of terms are necessary for doing this, starting with a term that allows one to express that A implies B, then turning to what terms are necessary for expressing that A does not imply B. He argues that a language with such terms will lead to an intuitionistic logic, but shows also that if room is made for "multiple conclusion" inferences, classical logic is possible, too. He also explains that if one starts with incompatibility instead of inference (as do Brandom and Alp Aker), the road to classical logical is smoother.

In Chapter Ten, Peregrin asks how an inferentialist can justify and know the rules of logic, such as modus ponens. For the inferentialist, the rules of logic are simply constitutive of the meaning of logical vocabulary. Modus ponens, for instance, is constitutive of the meaning of implication. Thus, Peregrin argues, they are trivially true. However, it is not trivial that a term for implication may be useful for a language to have. We can, thus, justify rules of logic by appeal to the usefulness of logical vocabulary.

In Chapter Eleven, Peregrin argues that it is misleading to call rules of logic "rules of reasoning". They do not tell us which conclusions we should or may draw, or which beliefs to keep. In the first instance, rules of logic govern the interpersonal activity of demonstration and proof. Roughly like the way that rules of chess make chess pieces the pieces that they are, rules of logic constitute (the content of) our beliefs, making them what they are. Thus, they are the very framework that allows us to have beliefs and so cannot be a guide for which beliefs to have.

As I indicated at the start of this review, this is a good book. There are, however, a few ways in which it could have been more thorough.

First, Peregrin's view of what it takes for there to be norms is not wholly convincing. He says that a disposition to infer B from A does not by itself suffice for there to be a norm that B follows from A. There must also be normative attitudes, people correcting those who do not comply with the putative norm. But if attitudes are simply a function of what people actually do or are disposed to do, and norms are a function of attitudes, then norms are a function of what people actually do or are disposed to do, and normative inferentialism collapses into causal inferentialism, which Peregrin had said were different. He is aware of this danger (esp. 75-76), but does almost nothing to avert it. In Making It Explicit, Brandom also tries to avert it, claiming that the game of giving and asking for reasons is "norms all the way down." However, many have doubted that Brandom succeeds.[2] Since the difference between normative and causal inferentialism is at the heart of Peregrin's view, he needs to address this danger more thoroughly and convincingly.

Second, Peregrin is too quick when discussing "Strong Inferentialism," the idea that rules of inference should be broadened to include rules not just for moves from claims to claims, but from observable circumstances to claims. He admits that the move from an observable circumstance (e.g., a cat in front of you) to a claim ('Lo, a cat!') is not normally regarded as an inference, and probably should not be so regarded (37). After all, doing so would seem to imply that observable circumstances are claims. Instead, he proposes that because such moves are norm-governed, they "may be seen as sufficiently inference like to warrant the label inferentialism" (42). However, as Peregrin is aware, this argument is weak; being norm-governed does not make such moves interestingly similar to inferences. He should be more precise. In particular, he could have explained that such moves are governed by norms of rational criticism, the very sort of norms that govern moves from claims to claims. For instance, one may demand support for a claim made in response to an observable circumstance, and one may appeal to such a claim when challenged to defend another claim, or when challenging another claim. Clarifying and developing that idea is essential to showing how inferentialism makes sense of empirical vocabulary. Without it, the story about empirical vocabulary risks appearing as a merely non-inferentialist add-on. Moreover, several philosophers have had interesting and helpful things to say about the inferentialist's treatment of empirical vocabulary.[3] Peregrin missed a chance to further that discussion.

Third, although Peregrin is very good about addressing tempting and oft-repeated worries about inferentialism, there is one such worry that he does not address, a discussion of which would have made the book richer. Here is a version of it. Inferentialism conflicts with current orthodoxy in formal semantics, the project of systematically specifying the meanings of terms and sentences of natural languages. Inferentialism says that a sentence's meaning is its inferential role, but the current orthodoxy in formal semantics says that a sentence's meaning (as used on an occasion) is, at least in part, its truth-condition. Given this conflict, and the successes of currently orthodox formal semantics, inferentialism should be rejected.

One might be tempted to reply that this argument rests on a simple confusion: inferentialism does not aim to specify the meanings of individual terms and sentences of natural languages; it aims only to explain why terms and sentences have meaning at all, and the meanings that they do have. (That distinction is sometimes referred to as the distinction between semantics and meta-semantics.) But that response does not suffice, for the inferentialist does indeed appear to hold that word and sentence meanings are inferential roles. And that appears to conflict with the formal semanticist's claim, to put it loosely but provocatively, that the meanings of sentences are truth-conditions.

Granting this point, let me sketch one sort of reply that the inferentialist could make.[4] The point or purpose of any formal semantics, she might say, makes sense only within a broader framework. The explanatorily primitive terms of formal semantics, such as 'reference,' 'extension,' and 'true,' must ultimately be understood in terms of their inferential roles. To whatever extent we can specify the meanings of words and sentences in terms of 'reference,' 'extension,' and 'true,' we rely on an inferentialist understanding of those terms. That is just a sketch of a reply, but it is not obviously wrong. And given that smart philosophers have worried that the conflict between inferentialism and formal semantics is real, it would have been helpful for Peregrin to discuss that worry and this sort of reply.[5]

Although there are a few ways in which I think Peregrin's book might have been more thorough, I heartily recommend it to anyone who is interested in understanding the problems and prospects for inferentialism.[6]

[1] The idea is reminiscent of John Haugeland's discussion of semi-automatic, automatic, esoteric and empirical chess in "Truth and Rule-Following," in his Having Thought (Harvard University Press: Cambridge, MA. 1998). Unfortunately, Peregrin does not discuss Haugeland.

[2] For instance, Jay Rosenberg, "Brandom's Making It Explicit: A First Encounter," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 57.1 (1997): 179-187; Jürgen Habermas, "From Kant to Hegel: On Robert Brandom's Pragmatic Philosophy of Language," European Journal of Philosophy, 8.3 (2000): 322-355; Robert Pippin, "Brandom's Hegel," European Journal of Philosophy, 13.3 (2005): 381-408.

[3] In addition to several texts by Wilfrid Sellars, Robert Brandom, and John McDowell, see Michael P. Wolf, "Rigid Designation and Anaphoric Theories of Reference," Philosophical Studies 130 (2006): 351-75; Rebecca Kukla and Mark Lance, Yo! and Lo! (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2009), esp. Ch. 2.

[4] Brandom suggests a similar response (Making It Explicit, pp. 143-45). Peregrin expresses sympathy with it ("Developing Sellars's Semantic Legacy," in Wolf and Lance (eds.), The Self-Correcting Enterprise (New York: Rodopi, 2006), p. 273).

[5] Referring to Brandom's work on inferentialism, Timothy Williamson gestures at a similar argument ("How Did We Get Here from There? The Transformation of Analytic Philosophy?" Belgrade Philosophical Annual XXVII (2014), 34). In a brief blog post, Jason Stanley sketches a similar argument, defending it against various objections in the appended comments ("The Use Theory of Meaning," Leiter Reports (March 14, 2006)).

[6] Thanks to Nat Hansen and Michael Wolf for very helpful comments on an earlier draft.