Infinite Autonomy: The Divided Individual in the Political Thought of G. W. F. Hegel and Friedrich Nietzsche

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Jeffrey Church, Infinite Autonomy: The Divided Individual in the Political Thought of G. W. F. Hegel and Friedrich Nietzsche, Pennsylvania State University Press, 2011, 270pp., $64.95 (hbk), ISNB 9780271050751.

Reviewed by Steven Berg, Bellarmine University


Jeffrey Church has given us an odd book. First, the volume is largely devoted to an exposition of the thought of the two most important philosophers of the 19th century -- Hegel and Nietzsche. Yet philosophy as the quest for wisdom and wisdom as the object of that quest are entirely absent from its pages. Consequently, both Hegel's claim to have completed the history of philosophy in an ascent to wisdom, and Nietzsche's thought of the eternal return of the same as the "peak" of his philosophy, are never discussed.

Second, this book wishes to defend the legitimacy of the modern liberal democratic regime and its celebration of the primacy of the individual against all versions of the "traditional" or "communitarian" point of view. For Church the latter forms of government are instantiated above all in those opinions according to which human life must find its ground in sacred or divine law: "religion" (2). Sacred or divine law, however, are neglected as themes within his argument, and religion is mentioned rarely and only in passing. As a result, one would never guess, from reading Church's book, either that Hegel's claim to have transcended philosophy in the direction of wisdom is premised upon his claim to have translated the Christian revelation into the terms of reason, or that Nietzsche described religion as a "nervous disease" and wrote a book called The Anti-Christ.

Third, Church most often views Hegel and Nietzsche through the lens of Kantian moral philosophy, so that it appears that they shared Kant's understanding of nature as "a deterministic matrix of efficient causes" (12) and natural inclination as "pathologically determining" and that they celebrated as the core of the authentically human the capacity of the self-determining will to leave behind "brute nature" entirely in giving itself its own law (60-66, 126-28). Now it is perhaps not entirely implausible to paint Hegel in these colors (though his admiration for Goethe's elaboration of a non-Newtonian understanding of nature must appear incomprehensible on these premises); it is, however, impossible to ignore Nietzsche's emphatic rejection of Kant's moral philosophy (or any philosophy that has succumbed to the "seductions" of morality) and his loud declaration that he endeavors to "translate man back into nature" so that the "eternal basic text homo natura" may "once again be discerned" (Beyond Good and Evil 230; cf. Gay Science, 294).[1]

In any event,this Kantian frame appears to be a foreground aspect of Church's argument insofar as he declares that Hegel and Nietzsche are really the sons (whether legitimate or not is never adjudicated) of Jean-Jacques Rousseau and that each of them plays out one portion of Rousseau's philosophy to its "logical" conclusion. Hegel takes up the tendency most evident in the Social Contract, and Nietzsche the tendency articulated in the Reveries: "the opposed ideals of citizen and solitary dreamer" (6). The book really proves, therefore, to be a study ultimately not so much of a Kantian version of either Hegel's or Nietzsche's thought, but of two tendencies in Rousseau's reflections.  But the tendencies' principle of unity, for Rousseau himself, is never touched on in Church's exposition. Instead of approaching these aspects of Rousseau's thought as parts of a larger whole in the light of which they are alone intelligible, he takes them to be two fundamental doctrines and modes of conduct ("realized" by Hegel and Nietzsche) that are theoretically and practically irreconcilable (6).

Finally, and one must say, oddest of all, is the fact that the argument that Church elaborates over the course of the first 200 pages is abruptly, and most startlingly, repudiated in the last two pages of its conclusion. Like a conjurer who, having performed his series of tricks upon the stage, suddenly vanishes in a puff of smoke, Church cancels in the end the account that he has been at such pains to construct. Let me explain exactly how this transpires.

Church's account is built upon the foundation of certain fundamental presuppositions. I simply list them in order of precedence. He assumes that what it is to be a human being is found in the concept of individuality; that to be an individual involves, above all, crafting for oneself "an understanding of the good life" (9) free of any "external" determination, whether based upon natural reason or revelation, of a summum bonum. It follows, therefore, that the modern liberal regime is the best regime and that, consequently, the secular political order or the "separation of church and state" or the exclusion of religion from the public realm is desirable. It further follows that philosophy has above all a practical character and intention, that, as such, it must be "charitable" or humanitarian in disposition, that is, provide for the welfare of all human beings. Philosophy and with it human life as a whole must, therefore, be devoted to the mastery of nature (with nature understood to be barren of final causes). Philosophy devoted to such mastery is political in the crudest sense, that is, politically engaged and effective; therefore, it is the business of philosophy to provide a justification of the order of things for even the humblest sort of human life -- a "theodicy" adequate to the capacity of the common man.

These are remarkable, wide-ranging, and controversial claims. Church makes no real argument for the validity of any of them. They are taken as "givens." All of these claims are traceable to the thought of Francis Bacon and Thomas Hobbes. They are the fundamental assumptions of modern philosophy in its declaration of independence from ancient philosophy. They are not, however, taken to be self-evident by these early moderns who make complex, coherent, if not always convincing, arguments for their validity. Church devotes only two brief and sketchy paragraphs to these arguments (10), concentrating his real efforts instead on showing, with Hegel, the inadequacy of the thought of the early moderns, especially in regard to the issues of the justification of the priority of the individual and the legitimacy of the liberal regime. It is to this effort, therefore, that we must direct our attention. Not, however, before noting that, although Church pretends -- in the company of Rousseau, Kant, and Hegel -- to transcend the inadequacy of the early moderns in regard to these "ethical" issues, his -- and their -- arguments are determined entirely by the basic postulates of Bacon and Hobbes. He merely tinkers, therefore, with the "superstructure" built upon their foundations. Whether this tinkering is an improvement or not is one of the chief questions posed by Church's account.

The primary objection Church offers to the moral philosophy of the early moderns is its reliance upon nature, that is, the natural inclinations of human beings, for example, the fear of death or the desire for bodily continuance (11, 13). Church sees this reliance as inconsistent with the declared intention of early modern philosophy to liberate man from "nature's leading strings" and put him in a position of mastery over a hostile nature (14). Such mastery, in Church's view, ought to begin at home with the mastery and transcendence of one's own nature. Moreover, Church finds this reliance upon nature to be deficient in its moral tone: self-interest is a motive too low to give proper shape to our moral lives. Therefore, having successfully displaced traditional morality -- that is, the Christian religion -- as the foundation of political life, Hobbes and his followers have, according to Church's argument, left us with a banausic and feeble version of justice, divorced from any relation to the sacred or the noble, as the sole moral reality (15-17).

Church follows Rousseau and Kant in their efforts to "improve upon" the early moderns on this front by reinvigorating the modern project vis-à-vis morality with an infusion of the noble, stripped of any real vestiges of the tradition (23). The noble is re-construed upon modern principles: freedom, precisely as freedom from and mastery over nature, is recommended to the individual as individual and declared to be the truth of the noble. The self-legislating will, released from the bondage of natural inclination, is taken to be the core of humanity and the principle that lends worth and dignity to the life of each and every man. By these means, the noble is subjected to the demands of modern egalitarianism and of a moral doctrine constructed on radically modernist premises put forward as redemptive of the original sins of the initiators of the modern project (18-19, 23-24).

Rousseau, however, according to Church, is "inchoate" in his thought (6), and Kant is, as Hegel would have it, too "formal" (20-21). The solution to the incipiency of Rousseau and the contentlessness of Kant would seem to be "history." The wholly free, radically autonomous individual is the product of the historical "self-creation" of man. The true individual is the historical individual. His individuality is not, therefore, "abstract" or merely formal, but rich with a content provided by the "historical community" of which he is a part. So historicism, according to Church's argument, becomes the reviving tonic, rather than the poisoned chalice, for modernity. Rousseau's original insight, developed with German rigor and profundity, puts modernity on solid ground at last: Hegel's and Nietzsche's versions of the "historical individual" present themselves as the crowning achievement and final justification of the modern project (23).

Hegel, in Church's view, overcomes the incoherent "atomism" of early modern moral philosophy by arguing that individuality is not only compatible with but also necessarily founded upon community. But not all communities are created equal when measured by the standard of individuality. Only the modern liberal state, the final result of the historical process, allows for the satisfaction of the individual as such by allowing for the mutual recognition of citizens equal under a law that they understand themselves to have authorized (63-71). This mutual recognition, however, is accomplished not primarily on the political level as traditionally understood -- for example, participation in a legislative assembly -- but on the political-economic plane. It is in and through their labor as contributing to the "common" or "public good" that individuals both express their individuality and find that individuality reflected in the recognition they receive from their fellow laborers for their exertions (103-108). They are honored for their "unique" contributions to the larger collective whole and find "satisfaction" in recognizing themselves in the mirror of the corporate edifice. This satisfaction, however, requires for its realization, on the one hand, a kind of fiddling with techniques of management and the mediating structures of civil society (90-110) and, on the other hand, and above all, the effort on the part of the individual himself to develop a "coherent narrative" regarding his own life so that he may conform to the larger whole of political society but do so, at least in terms of the story he tells to himself about himself, with his own particular panache (51). The autonomous individual is the "self-narrating individual" (52). This continually revised narrative is the retrospective and prospective synopsis of the life of the ongoing, never to be completed subject -- the historical individual ensconced within the historical community (54).

Thus, according to Church's Hegel, the individual subject is made to be "at once identical with the universal [or collective] subject but also distinct from it as well. There is a perfect harmony . . . between individual and community" (75). This is utopian in the highest degree: the "common good" and the individual good are reconciled and integrated without remainder or the slightest trace of residual tension.

It is Nietzsche who points out that Hegel's solution to the human problem is bought at the price of the elimination of the human. The Hegelian utopia requires the reduction of the human spirit to the spirit of the beehive. Church seems to agree with Nietzsche's estimate: Hegel needs Nietzsche if he is not to be the herald of the "last man." Thus Nietzsche's "overman" comes forward as the savior of man from the diminutions of modernity and the homogenizing and collectivist tendencies of the liberal state. The latter are thwarted by that state being made a platform for certain exceptional individuals in their efforts to found new modes and orders not in the political realm, but in the trans-political sphere of culture. This, for Church's Nietzsche, involves self-creation on the part of the "genius" or "sovereign individual" -- "life as art" (130, 135). Again such autonomous activity is embodied or at least finds its summit in the act of telling "the story of me" (132, 202). These self-celebrating rhetorical feats, however, do not find their terminus in the self insofar as these tall-tales become an item of "erotic" fascination and emulation, an "ideal" both aesthetic and moral, for one's fellows who thereby are made the public reflection of such self-creating individuality. The community is thus redeemed and justified by the presence of the "genius" within its midst, and the self-celebrating genius is likewise made concrete by the community that finds in him its "ideal" (150-62). Individual and community are reconciled anew and utopia restored.

Church attempts to show that Nietzsche's sovereign individual is thoroughly historicized by pulling in Zarathustra's speech "On Redemption" to support his view that the exceptional individual redeems not only the community in its present constitution, but the deficient past that must inevitably haunt it. Through the creative will of the individual the past becomes a precondition for his "self-constructed personality" (137). Such founding of "human community" in the form of "artistic cultures" not only transfigures the past, but also redeems human life as such from the tragic wisdom of Silenus, according to which it is best for a human being never to have been born (147). The nullity of human existence is overcome by the rhapsody of "the ongoing story of me" (202). This is, in Church's view, "the only possible theodicy for Nietzsche" (137).

Certain readers may find it difficult to recognize the Nietzsche they are familiar with in Church's account. For those readers our author compounds their difficulty by insisting that, in the last analysis, Nietzsche doffs his aristocratic mask and "reveals himself to be friendly to democracy" (187). He is the culture-vulture complement to Hegel's political-economic justification of the liberal regime. It is the liberal regime, after all, that provides the stage upon which the self-promoting, self-celebrating individual may strut his stuff. (189).

So we are given Church's Hegel and Church's Nietzsche as developing the two tendencies of Rousseau's thought that Church finds fundamental -- fundamental but opposed. And, by Church's estimation, nothing can genuinely reconcile these colliding strategies for embodying, while justifying, the "infinite autonomy" of the modern individual. Still, though irreconcilable, they are also inseparable. The "citizen" longs for the independence of the "solitary dreamer" and the "solitary dreamer for the 'solidarity' of citizenship" (6-7). Church's "claim then is that the historical individual rests on an internally divided notion of human subjectivity. It bears a wound that cannot be healed, an internal bifurcation already seen by Rousseau and incapable of being reconciled in theory" or practice. (209). The individual as part of the whole of the political community cannot be made congruent with the individual as existing beyond and as the ultimate trans-political goal of the political community. Utopia proves to be an illusion. "We must give up our hope for infinite autonomy" given the contradictory character of the "two infinities" proposed by Hegel and Nietzsche. "Human self-sufficiency hence appears impossible for divided beings such as ourselves" (209-10).

Here we arrive at the self-dissolution of Church's argument referred to above. In the last pages of the book its apparent objective "to defend individuality of a certain sort, [viz.] the historical individual" (3) is abandoned; and, though we were given to understand from the beginning that Hegel's and Nietzsche's attempts to ground this concept might prove problematic, we were not forewarned that Church's ultimate intention was to declare that in the wake of their failure no such ground can be discovered or defense offered. This, however, seems to be the final word of the book. As a consequence, Church's argument implies, seemingly in spite of itself, that individuality is a self-contradictory concept, that freedom as autonomy is a chimera, that the liberal regime lacks legitimacy, that the modern project cannot be relieved of its incoherence and vulgarity, and that the nothingness of human existence is irredeemable. The book concludes with a council of despair and a reiteration of the tragic wisdom of Silenus in regard to modernity and human life as such. Might it be that, true to his name, Church is on the verge of succumbing to the temptations of the "traditionalist" and "communitarian" views he so vigorously rejects at the outset of his argument? Given the apparent poverty of modernity, where is one to find consolation if not in a return to the religion of one's fathers?

Such a conclusion is perhaps inevitable if one ignores the arguments of the founders of modernity, both implicit and explicit, that reveal the intention of these founders and with it theraison d'etre of the modern project. When it comes to considering the status of the modern notions of the "free and equal" individual and the liberal regime designed to secure his life and liberty, Hobbes is indispensible. By arguing that the individual and the rights of the individual precede and form the sole legitimate end of the construction and conduct of civil society, Hobbes attempts to put civil society upon entirely new footing. He jettisons the sacred and the divine as the foundations of political life and thereby parts company with the tradition of millennia. The state of nature in which the rights of the individual are most manifest and from which they are derived is a state entirely denuded of sacred limits or of any effective law, divine or otherwise.

Hobbes' effort to eliminate the sacred and the divine from the pre-political foundations of political life, however, is wholly in the service of his effort, undertaken in conjunction with his teacher and friend Francis Bacon, to dislodge, insofar as possible, the power of religion over men's minds. Together they initiate a double assault upon such power, one from the side of modern natural science (by rendering implausible an appeal to the presence of final causes in nature as evidence of divine creation of the world and rendering plausible the prospect of immortality in this life) and the other from the side of modern political science (by subordinating religion to policy of state or confining it to the private realm).

Of this much Church is more or less aware. What he does not recognize is that this assault is a strategy instrumental to the ultimate goal of promoting not primarily the freedom or welfare of the common man, but the freedom and welfare of the most uncommon of men -- the philosopher. The liberation of philosophy from its subordination to Christian theology was the primary intention of the founders of modernity, Hobbes preeminent among them. For, as Hobbes himself declares, not revelation, but "true philosophy [is] the wisest guide of human life, [and] the peculiar distinction of human nature" (Leviathan, Latin version, Chapter XLVI). The author who resolutely rejects the notion, redolent of scholastic theology, of the summum bonum at the opening of his great work, embraces the good for man by nature at its end. He thereby reveals his agreement on this crucial point with the whole of the philosophical tradition before him: the good for a human being according to nature is the life of philosophy. What in the end justifies and legitimates the liberal regime for its inventor, Thomas Hobbes, is identical to what alone redeems human life for the philosopher Friedrich Nietzsche: not the so-called individual as defined by the freedom of the will in its self-determination, but the genuine individual defined by the freedom of the mind in its search for the eternal truth (Gay Science 324; Dawn 550). The implication of these remarks is clear: if the question of philosophy as it is articulated in the writings of the greatest thinkers is ignored, the character and intention of the political philosophy they transmit will inevitably be misunderstood.

In the end one is compelled to conclude that, contrary to Church's view, the apparent inconsistency in the thought of the early modern philosophers is one of their greatest strengths. Their continued reliance upon nature and human nature, in its lowest and highest instances, despite their overt or popular appeal to the mastery and transformation of nature, made their thought sober and, in the last analysis, consistent. Such sobriety and consistency are foreign to the dominant tendency of late modernity -- that historicism, the incoherence of which Church displays in the volume under consideration.

[1] Church himself takes note of this passage from Beyond Good and Evil, but wholly misconstrues its import: if Nietzsche takes the eternal character of human nature as his desideratum, he not only parts company with Kant, but with historicism as well (114).