Infinite Paths to Infinite Reality: Sri Ramakrishna and Cross-Cultural Philosophy of Religion

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Ayon Maharaj, Infinite Paths to Infinite Reality: Sri Ramakrishna and Cross-Cultural Philosophy of Religion, Oxford University Press, 2018, 350pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190868239.

Reviewed by Samta Pandya, Tata Institute of Social Sciences


This book-length study in English of Ramakrishna's philosophy is an important contribution to the field of cross-cultural religion. On the basis of Ramakrishna's teachings, Ayon Maharaj, develops new approaches to religious pluralism, mystical experience, and the problem of evil. He argues that the Bengali philosopher-mystic Ramakrishna's nineteenth century ideas have epistemological sophistication and are also relevant in contemporary times. Specifically, Maharaj says that, Ramakrishna's spiritual journey that culminated in the exalted state of "vijnana" -- his term for the "intimate knowledge" of God as the Infinite Reality that is both personal and impersonal, formed and formless, immanent in the universe and beyond it -- opens up new paradigms for discussing cross-cultural philosophy of religion. Maharaj substantiates this by indicating lines of conversation between Ramakrishna's philosophy and various contemporary Western thinkers such as Benedikt Paul Gocke, John Hick, and others. More fundamentally, he argues that Ramakrishna's unique mystico-philosophical perspective not only challenges some of the fundamental presuppositions of recent Western philosophy of religion and theology but also provides entirely new strategies for addressing, and potentially resolving, cross-cultural philosophical problems.

The work is divided into four parts and eight chapters. The four parts are entitled: "The Infinitude of God", "Religious Pluralism", "Mystical Experience" and "The Problem of Evil". An interesting aspect is the discussion on methodological postlude in the intriguing prologue.

 Maharaj  rightly says that to date few books in English have been  devoted to Ramakrishna. Existing works include historical studies (Amiya Sen), psychobiographical studies (Carl Olson, Narasingha Sil, Jeffrey Kripal), critique of such psychobiographical treatises (Swami Tyagananda and Pravrajika Vrajapana) and articles and book chapters on different aspects of Ramakrishna's philosophy (Walter Neevel, Freda Matchett, Satis Chandra Chatterjee, Swami Tapasyananda, Arindam Chakrabarti, Swami Bhajananda, Jeffrey D. Long). Building on these historical studies and articles, Maharaj argues that a book-length treatment of Ramakrishna's philosophy is needed for three main reasons: a) his ideas are original and constitute a significant, yet neglected, chapter in the history of Indian philosophical thought; b) his teachings influenced some of the important figures in modern Indian thought, including Swami Vivekananda, Aurobindo, Rabindranath Tagore, Mahatma Gandhi, and Sarvapalli Radhakrishnan; and c) his philosophical positions resonate strongly with Western philosophy of religion, thereby warranting a cross-cultural philosophical inquiry. Maharaj says that Ramakrishna's remarkably expansive conception of God as the impersonal-personal Infinite Reality provides a powerful alternative to the narrow theistic paradigm of many Western philosophers and theologians.

Methodologically, this book combines detailed exegesis with cross-cultural philosophical investigation. Ramakrishna's philosophical views are reconstructed on the basis of his recorded oral teachings. Maharaj relies on two primary Bengali source-texts for information on Ramakrishna's life and teachings -- Mahendranath Gupta's Sri Sri Ramakrishna Kathamrita (or the Gospel of Sri Ramakrishna) and Swami Saradananda's detailed biography entitled Sri Sri Ramakrishna Lilaparasanga (containing detailed accounts of Ramakrishna's spiritual practices and mystical experiences). Mahendranath Gupta and Swami Saradananda were close aides and disciples of Ramakrishna and hence Maharaj authoritatively substantiates on the reliability of their works as core sources of references on the life and teachings of Ramakrishna.

In terms of this cross-cultural philosophical investigation, Maharaj claims an active participation in the recent movement away from comparative philosophy and towards more creative and flexible paradigms for engaging in philosophical inquiry across cultures. Hence, rather than comparing Ramakrishna with Western philosophers, Maharaj brings Ramakrishna into creative dialogue with recent Western thinkers, engaging primarily with the works of recent analytic philosophers of religion, with the exception of continental thinkers. It could be the subject matter of another book to bring Ramakrishna into dialogue with continental thinkers such as Soren Kierkegaard, Martin Heidegger, Emmanuel Levinas, Jacques Derrida, and Merold Westphal.

The eight chapters discuss the following four topics in the philosophy of religion: the infinitude of God (chapters 1 and 2), religious pluralism (chapters 3 and 4), the nature and epistemology of mystical experience (chapters 5 and 6), and the problem of evil (chapters 7 and 8).

In chapter 1, Maharaj reconstructs Ramakrishna's overall philosophical framework by arguing that his philosophy is best characterized as "Vijnana Vedanta," a resolutely nonsectarian worldview rooted in his own mystical experience of vijnana that harmonizes apparently conflicting religious faiths, sectarian philosophies, and spiritual disciplines. On this basis he argues that Ramakrishna affirms that both the impersonal non-dual Brahman of Advaitins (non-dualists) and the loving personal God of theists are equally real aspects of one and the same Infinite Reality.

In chapter 2, Maharaj investigates the nature of divine infinitude from a cross-cultural perspective by bringing Ramakrishna into conversation with classical Indian philosophers as well as Western philosophers and theologians. He identifies what is distinctive in Ramakrishna's conception of divine infinitude within the Indian philosophical context by comparing it with a range of Vedantic views. In the latter part of this chapter, Maharaj identifies some striking affinities between Ramakrishna's conception of the Infinite God and the medieval Christian theologian Nicholas of Cusa's doctrine of God as the coincidentia oppositorum ("coincidence of opposites"). He then brings Ramakrishna into dialogue with the contemporary analytic theologian Gocke. According to Gocke, God is infinite in the radical sense that God is not subject to the law of contradiction and, therefore, should be analyzed in terms of "paraconsistent logic." [1] Maharaj contends that while Gocke's argument helps clarify the paraconsistent underpinnings of Ramakrishna's own conception of the Infinite God, Ramakrishna pursues the paraconsistent logic of divine infinitude more fully and consistently than does Gocke. Further, Maharaj also triangulates Ramakrishna and Gocke with the contemporary Continental philosopher Jean-Luc Marion's critique of various forms of "conceptual idolatry" and his positive account of God as agape, which, Maharaj says resonate with Ramakrishna's views on divine infinitude.

In chapter 3, Maharaj argues that Ramakrishna's spiritual standpoint of vijnana holds the key to understanding his nuanced position on religious diversity. He does this by reconstructing from Ramakrishna's teachings a philosophically sophisticated model of religious pluralism. Since God is the impersonal-personal Infinite Reality as per Ramakrishna, there are correspondingly infinite ways of approaching and realizing God. Therefore, all religions and spiritual philosophies -- both theistic and nontheistic -- that  Maharaj derives are effective paths to one common goal: God-realization, or the direct spiritual experience of God in any of His innumerable forms or aspects. Conflicting religious truth-claims, which are a thorny issue, Maharaj says, can be reconciled on the basis of Ramakrishna's capacious ontology of God. Religions err on truth-claims, but this does not diminish their salvific efficacy. This argument is used to defend Ramakrishna's religious pluralism against objections by scholars such as Neufeldt and Smart.

In chapter 4, Maharaj explores Hick's early and late views on religious pluralism in light of Ramakrishna. Between 1970 and 1974, Hick espoused a Vedantic theory of religious pluralism -- based explicitly on Aurobindo's "logic of the infinite" -- that aligns with Ramakrishna's vijnana-based pluralist model. This says that since each religion captures at least one true aspect of the Infinite Reality, the various conceptions of the Divine Reality taught by the major world religions are complementary rather than conflicting. By 1976, Hick abandoned this older line of thought in favor of his new quasi-Kantian theory of religious pluralism, according to which the personal and non-personal ultimates of the various world religions are different phenomenal forms of the same unknowable "Real an sich." However, this quasi-Kantian pluralist model fails to honor the self-understanding of most religious practitioners, who take their respective ultimates to be literally, and not merely phenomenally, true. This, then, according to Maharaj, makes Ramakrishna's vijnana-based model more philosophically viable since it grants full ontological reality to the personal and nonpersonal ultimates of the various religions.

In chapter 5, Maharaj draws upon Ramakrishna's teachings to develop a new conceptual framework for understanding the nature of mystical experience. He identifies the strengths and limitations of two conflicting approaches, perennialism and constructivism, in recent analytic philosophy of religion. Thereafter, he argues that Ramakrishna is the proponent of 'manifestationist' approach to mystical experience that provides a compelling dialectical alternative to both perennialism and constructivism. The 'manifestationist' approach, based on Ramakrishna's vijnana, asserts that mystics in various traditions experience different real manifestations of the same impersonal-personal Infinite Reality.

In chapter 6, Maharaj explores how Ramakrishna's mystical teachings enrich contemporary philosophical debates about the epistemic value of mystical experience. One key question is debated upon: are we rationally justified in taking mystical experiences -- either our own or those of others -- to be veridical? Ramakrishna's mystical testimony, Maharaj argues, lends strong support to the philosopher Robert Oakes's position that self-authenticating experiences of God are logically possible. Chapter 6 then focuses on the argument from experience, which proposes that it is reasonable to believe that God exists on the basis of the testimony of people claiming to have experienced Him. Maharaj says that what Ramakrishna defended in a simple way (the idea of personal experience of God) finds parallels in arguments of recent philosophers such as Richard Swinburne and Jerome Gellman. Two of the following serious objections to the argument from experience are thus diffused: first, that mystical experiences, unlike sensory ones, cannot be adequately cross-checked; and second, that different mystics often make conflicting claims about the nature of the ultimate reality they experience.

In the first chapter in the section that deals with the problem of evil, Maharaj reconstructs Ramakrishna's multifaceted response to the problem. Reference is made to instances of pointless evil (e.g. mass slaughter or genocide) and the fact that they make it reasonable to believe that either God does not exist or that God is omnipotent and omniscient but not perfectly good. Ramakrishna answered this by saying that the ways of an omniscient and omnipotent God are inscrutable to the finite human intellect. Maharaj says that this can be understood as skeptical theism. Since human beings have cognitive limitations, there is never a rational justification for believing that God has no morally sufficient reason for permitting a given instance of evil. This is then dovetailed with a full-blown theodicy -- a positive account of why God permits evil and suffering. Maharaj reconstructs Ramakrishna's saint-making theodicy (God permits evil in order to create saints) by explaining that through the experience of good and evil in the course of many lives, evil tendencies are combatted and ethical and spiritual values are cultivated. Finally, from a mystical standpoint, where God is everything in the universe (both good and evil), the problem of evil, which presupposes the difference, loses its urgency.

In the last chapter, Maharaj adopts a cross-cultural approach to the problem of evil by comparing Ramakrishna's skeptical theism with William Alston's skeptical theist refutation of William Rowe's argument from evil against God's existence. Finally, Maharaj brings Ramakrishna's saint-making theodicy into dialogue with Hick's "soul-making" theodicy. Hick argues for the necessity of evil in a soul-making environment, which support Ramakrishna's saint-making theodicy.[2] Furthermore, Hick's argument that a successful theodicy must accept the view that everyone will be saved helps to clarify the importance of the doctrine of universal salvation in Ramakrishna's own theodicy. Maharaj, however, says that Hick's theodicy has weaknesses, which emerge from his Christian assumption of a one-life-only paradigm and his neglect of mystical experience. On this basis, he makes the case that Ramakrishna's mystically grounded saint-making theodicy, which presupposes rebirth, has significant philosophical advantages.

This book demonstrates the relevance of Ramakrishna's philosophical positions and arguments to contemporary debates in analytic philosophy of religion. In light of ongoing methodological discourses (see his discussion of methodological postlude), Majaraj has successfully adopted a flexible and reciprocal cross-cultural methodology. He has skillfully shown how Ramakrishna's philosophical perspective sheds new light on debates in contemporary philosophy of religion. At the same time, he has also drawn on the conceptual resources of mainstream analytic philosophy in order to illuminate and strengthen Ramakrishna's own views and arguments. This work has a broad interdisciplinary appeal, and would be a good reference for scholars of religious studies, Hindu studies, and comparative theology.

[1] Benedikt Paul Gocke, "The Paraconsistent God," in Rethinking the Concept of a Personal God, ed. Thomas Schartl, Christian Tapp, and Veronika Wegener (Münster: Aschendorff, 2016), 177.

[2] John Hick, Evil and the God of Love (London: Palgrave Macmillan, [1966] 2010), 351.