Infinite Phenomenology: The Lessons of Hegel's Science of Experience

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John Russon, Infinite Phenomenology: The Lessons of Hegel's Science of Experience, Northwestern University Press, 2016, 392pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780810131910.

Reviewed by Michael Vater, Marquette University


John Russon offers a second volume on Hegel’s Phenomenology that emphasizes not the historical text but the pedagogy one might draw from serious consideration of Hegel’s description of the individual, social, and institutional structures of self-consciousness. It is particularly welcome, in this time where circumstances seem to exacerbate differences among cultures, classes, ethnicities, political arrangements and religions  Its logical lessons on the differences between the infinite and the finite, and the particular and the universal point to solutions that involve not totalitarian flight to abstract (or imposed) universals, religious or political, but a patient abiding with difference and exploration of the particularity of human social organization — “ethicality” or Sittllichkeit. The book’s language is fluid and jargon-free; the Hegelian experiential lessons it expounds would be useful in both higher-level undergraduate and graduate courses. They are supported by an exoskeleton of textual scholarship, including German citations and a brief history of 20th century Francophone Hegel interpretation. I find the book engaging, deep, and useful.

When one looks at a dense text like Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit, which promises to “meet the needs of the time” by recapitulating modern conditions of existence — individual, social, and institutional — two alternatives open up.  One can read the text backwards, viewing it as an historical document and trying to identify the persons, ideas, social and cultural movements, and political events it incorporates; this is more or less the way we are forced to read an antique author like Dante, for one must muster vast amounts of erudition — even sympathy for lost world-views — to vividly enter the poet’s mid-life crisis. In Hegel’s case, however, we can read forward, inquiring how the philosopher’s reconstruction of life experience can help us live our lives now and solve our current problems. Russon offers such a forward-facing reading, contending there are “lessons” to be derived from the Phenomenology. Evidently Hegel’s ambition, stated early in the Jena period, to have humans “learn how to live” from radically reformed religion or philosophy, is sufficiently realized in the 1807 text. The work can stand alone as a sort of life-catechism, and not shrink to the insignificance of being just a preparatory exercise for systematic philosophy or a series of singular thought experiments waiting to be distilled into the elixir of dialectical method in the work’s Preface.

J.N. Findlay remarked that it was not worth the effort to read the 19th and 20th century British Idealists as heirs of Kant or Hegel because their grand systems smacked too much of empire, colonialism, and Eurocentrism. The march of abstract categories to the triumph of the Universal was just too systematic, and reason far too hegemonic for the power of the negative and the persistence of the particular (‘ethicality’) to manifest their true force. Following French 20th century interpretations of Hegel instead, which increasingly focused on the Phenomenology rather than the Encyclopedia of Philosophical Sciences, Russon produces a reading of Hegel attuned not to a false beyond of an imagined universality, but to the stickiness of particularity as we experience it. For we live in a time when Enlightenment ideals and institutions are accounted an embarrassment, and where the refractory claims of particular traditions, ethnicities, religions and political institutions seem to portend perpetual strife and widespread human misery. Cultural insularity, racism, xenophobia, a resurgent and noisy nationalism, and the rejection of human equality in favor of ‘exceptionalism’ are the content of our daily news. As a counterweight, Russon uses Hegel to forge an argument for tolerance and open-ended pluralistic cultural exploration.  He chiefly derives these ideas from Hegel’s analysis of the traditional pull of situated custom (Sittlichkeit), its conflict with the pretended universality of an imposed morality, the rebellion of conscience, and the religious solution of forgiveness. His Hegel interpretation is guided by the readings of the Phenomenology offered by Jean Wahl, Alexandre Kojève, and Jean Hyppolite early in 20th century France. He follows recent American scholars such as John Sallis, Kenneth Schmitz, and Quentin Lauer in arguing that historical texts can be situationally recovered and employed to solve contemporary problems. On the concept of infinitude in the Phenomenology, he follows recent contributions by H.S. Harris and Stephen Houlgate who argue that ‘infinity’ or ‘absoluteness’ is ingredient in our present experience and is not an abstract ‘beyond.’ These influences are cheerfully acknowledged; to present an idiosyncratic reading of the one philosopher who strove to present “authorless” (that is, true) philosophy would be oxymoronic.

A note on terminology: I spoke above of “open-ended pluralistic cultural exploration” to represent Russon’s multiculturalism or (less often) cosmopolitanism. The former term sets my teeth on edge, for in almost all contemporary discussions it provokes immediate and unreflective responses; it is ideologically radioactive. What Russon wishes to advance is the idea of an attitude that patiently explores a plurality of attitudes, a viewpoint that doesn’t deflate to any — ism. Kant’s old term is serviceable, but quaint sounding. What he advocated in the Anthropology lectures was a form of equanimity based on ‘worldliness’ or broad experience. In practice, its operation is to suspend judgment, precisely not to suspend the tension of particularities. Max Müller advanced the dictum for the critical study of religions, “If you only know one, you don’t know any.”

Russon’s Hegelian lessons loosely follow the structure and method of the Phenomenology, though he is not here offering a textual commentary. He offers a specific, i.e., particularistic or differential reading of both human life and Hegel’s text, although he does not claim it is the only possible interpretation. His reading is supported by German texts presented in the endnotes, though his own philosophical language is so fluid and current that there is a bit of a shock whenever a citation is introduced. Hegel’s own words force a reader to a slow and careful consideration of ideas sometimes cryptically embedded in logic-talk. The life-lessons that are Russon’s main concern are bookended by helpful essays on the experiential method of the Phenomenology and that text’s relation to the dance of objectivity and intersubjectivity which is the subject of the Science of Logic.

To speak of “life-lessons” might mislead a likely reader into thinking that a ‘graphic novel’ version of the Phenomenology or a Hegel for Dummies is on offer. We probably are all dummies when it comes to the stickiness of the particular: the fact that singular pieces of the human brain/biology are nurtured by clumps of humanity—families, communities, languages, classes, races and religions—and that only in such clumps can we pretend we are specimens of homo sapiens sapiens. Identification and antagonism are the brick and mortar of every human edifice. So if there is any point in life where one needs help, it is here. And the help needed is not a dead algorithm; Spinoza and Schelling tried that. One needs to learn to go through life as Goethe’s Werther or Faust, or perhaps Cervantes’ Quixote, or Dante’s persona led by Virgil.

A familiar triadic structure permeates the central discussion of Hegelian themes — reality, personality, and freedom — and the presentation of the individual essays as well. It is only fitting that Hegelian pedagogy structure the presentations, and that the second moment of negation, challenge, and otherness be especially vivid and problematic. To this end, Russon brings in contemporary non-Hegelian voices to challenge or support an initial position presented in linear fashion: Derrida, Deleuze-Guattari, R.D. Laing, Merleau-Ponty, Sartre and de Beauvoir. These are intelligent and illuminating additions, and though brief they are authoritative and not doctrinaire. Derrida’s ethical and political writings on topics like immigration and the Palestinian problem come close to what Russon thinks is Hegelian truth, though Derrida himself pronounces himself the enemy of ‘absolute knowing’ and advances dilfférance as the antithesis of an all-devouring dialectic. The third and concluding moment in the essays, the one that explicitly ‘draws the lesson’, either lets stand an impasse that is irresolvable (Antigone and Creon) or points forward to the ultimate non-resolution offered by religion or ‘faith’: forgiveness — or forbearance of judgment. The ‘religion of revelation’ that Hegel offers is a rugged one: the absolute appears as the finite, as the finite canceled (Crucifixion), but not elsewhere than in the finite.

Russon’s essays somewhat overlap but are organized around three headings that adequately capture both the continuity and discontinuity of Hegel’s text. Three essays explore human cognition; five explore the psychological and social dynamics, especially the conflicts, that underpin personal identity and social existence; six essays explore institutions that claim to transcend particularistic conflict and achieve universality — politics, morality, and especially religion. Where Hegel’s text strews perplexity in the path of those like Harris who would reconstruct the writing of the text, Russon’s division of human reality into knowing, desiring, and (collectively) acting seems both straightforward and comprehensive. It recapitulates Kant’s dry division of the distinct human capacities for truth and falsity, pleasure and displeasure, and good and evil, except that it is the genius of the genetic narrative of the Phenomenology to turn a chart into a life-adventure. Of course, life itself seems to get more vivid when Hegel overwrites Kant’s serene ‘capacity for [aesthetic] pleasure or displeasure’ with the single word desire.

Perhaps a glance at a single essay might shed light on how Russon approaches Hegel’s text and distills life-lessons from it. An initial exposition of Hegel’s project in the Phenomenology of Spirit rests on Hegel’s subtitle and initial dialectical moves. Russon’s concern is not with Hegel’s claim to scientific or rigorous status but with the object of this philosophical study, the experience of consciousness. Hegel’s aim is to describe consciousness in its origin and development, and to urge the reader to an experiential reenactment of the text. This descriptive approach can claim scientific status only because it is not subjectively interpreted, but self-interpreting. Philosophy, if true, is authorless; the one who crafts a philosophy removes her subjectivity from what she works on, the way the artist subtracts his point of view from his work to allow the work to emerge as an independent entity, or the way the religious seeker removes her ego or even her final ambition from her quest.

In a first look at what appears, the observer sees the immediate reality of the ‘here’ and ‘now’ inflate into a multiplicity of ‘here-now’s and the simple reality of what is apprehended explode into a series of ’is’es. Two things happen at this initial stage: (1) what first appears or the ‘first object’ shows up as a double appearance, both substance and subject, connected and interdependent; description and interpretative point of view are yoked from the start; (2) “what appears is always infinite,” for the object of experience, while given only in experience, turns out to always be more than the experience gives, or something not defined by that single experience. What Russon here calls ‘the infinite’ is what Kant called the a priori. The continua of space and time (and all subsequent transcendental structures) are internal to the happening of experience and constitutive of its objectivity. What Hegel’s philosophical observer sees at first glance is the network of objectivity and intersubjectivity that is the final object of Kant’s labor in the Critique of Pure Reason.

Russon is correct in seeing this initial observation/analysis as the counterpart of Kant’s Transcendental Aesthetic. But ‘the infinite’ he introduces here is more than the static horizon of conceptuality that Kant introduced to explain cognition, and which he had to supplement with the Transcendental Deductions’ hypothesis of behind-the-scenes activity of synthesis or imaginative integration. Russon himself doesn’t invoke activity language here, but points to the both-at-and-beyond-the-limit character of the finite’s tango with the infinite as the motor for consciousness’s development, equally ingredient in the tension between inclusion and exclusion that is basic to recognition and in the peculiar form of identity that a person or (more abstractly) a community experiences: a call to identity that is always beyond already achieved identities. A further comparison to Kant might be helpful: Russon asserts not only that there is one, but multiple absolutes. An absolute cannot exist qua absolute, much less multiple absolutes, so what we self-conscious subjects do to instantiate absolutes makes a difference — not just psychologically, but ontologically. In saying this, it seems that Russon is reversing Kant’s judgment on the ideas of reason; they have not just a regulative or heuristic function, but are in some sense constitutive of self-consciousness.

A word about the word absolute: when Schelling and Hegel use to term to denote ultimate reality, they resort to the novel term not, say, “God” in a vague or non-denominational way, nor to ape Enlightenment deism, nor to reproduce Spinoza’s double-entry ontology with self-enclosed substance on one side of ledger and elaborated modal reality on the other. The term connotes ideal ultimacyAnselm’s “greater than that which cannot be conceived” — without any existence claim, with all hopes of a conceptual derivation of existence surrendered. Kant had it right: all proofs for the divine existence collapse into the ontological proof, which is not a proof but a category mistake. Russon cites Schelling’s final word on religion in the System of Transcendental Idealism, the work which recruited Hegel to Jena in 1801: “God never exists, for if existence is that which presents itself in the objective world, if He existed thus, we should not; but He continually reveals himself.” For Russon, this continual revelation or the appearance of the infinite in and at the site of finite self-consciousness is the crossing to two different logical structures: the modal relationship of possibility and actuality in which concreteness means that the latter is conceptually thinner than the former, and the temporal relationship of pastness and futurity in which only so much that is the heritage of the past can be realized in the present, and only so much of the future is realizable due to the determinacy of the past and present. Ontologically, there is no past or future except in the present, nor any possibility outside of what actually obtains; conceptually, the finite lags behind the infinite.

Let me conclude with a personal anecdote about Russon’s cross-cultural pedagogy. Twenty years ago, I spent two months in occupied Gaza City, teaching South Asian and East Asian philosophies to 25 Palestinian students — 23 Muslim and two Greek Orthodox. The period was lit by the brief ray of hope emitted by the Oslo accords; three North American universities cooperated to educate these speech therapists. It was an immersive educational experience for me and each of the students, almost a trip to the casino with all one’s cultural cash. I was overwhelmed by the hospitality of these young people and their families. I started with Islamic philosophy and an intense conversation unfolded over the next 49 days. I lucked out; a colleague teaching modern European history was greeted with shouts of “Yankee, go home!” the final week.