Infinity in Early Modern Philosophy

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Ohad Nachtomy and Reed Winegar (eds.), Infinity in Early Modern Philosophy, Springer, 2018, 211pp., $119.99 (hbk), 9783319945552.

Reviewed by Adam Harmer, University of California, Riverside


As José Benardete observes, "the concept of the infinite is found to impinge on almost the whole schedule of ontological questions" (Infinity, viii). This is especially true for the early moderns, for whom questions like the following were still very much in play: Does the world have a beginning? Are there bounds to the spatial extent of the world? How does an imperfect creation flow from an infinitely perfect creator? How does the infinite divisibility of the continuum relate to the structure of the material world? How are human actions related to the (possibly) infinite chain of causes or influences that shape our behaviors? Far from being an esoteric topic, which is best relegated to the outskirts of metaphysics or mathematics, infinity has tendrils reaching into nearly every philosophical domain.

True to Benardete's insight, this collection aims to acknowledge the reach of the concept of infinity during the early modern period: a guiding principle of the volume is that "early modern philosophers employed various conceptions of the infinite in a wide variety of mathematical, scientific, and theological contexts" (4). Ohad Nachtomy and Reed Winegar, the volume's editors, note, "we do not think that any volume on the topic of infinity in early modern philosophy can claim to be comprehensive, and we make no such claims for this volume" (4). (One is tempted to make a joke about traversing the infinite here.) Instead of trying to be comprehensive, "the volume focuses in large part on three figures [Descartes, Spinoza, Leibniz] for whom infinity played an especially crucial role . . . and concludes with Kant" (4). As an organizing principle, this works well enough, but it still would have been nice to see a broader engagement with other thinkers, since the views of the four selected have been fairly well studied.

Anat Schechtman, Yitzhak Y. Melamed, and Richard T. W. Arthur track the ways in which Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz engage with both traditional and emerging distinctions among types of infinity. In the background is the traditional Aristotelian distinction between the potential and actual infinite. Of course, most philosophers since Aristotle have eschewed the actual infinite, opting instead for the safe haven of the merely potential infinite. These three papers are cognizant of the Aristotelian background while also attempting to overlay the developing early modern taxonomies of the infinite.

Schechtman argues that Descartes's conception of the indefinite should be distinguished from the infinite on the basis that the former is an "iterative" notion while the latter is an "ontic" one (i.e. the infinity of being). Schechtman's distinctions are cogent, and the view developed has advantages over previous attempts to interpret Descartes's conception of the indefinite. However, the resulting conception of the indefinite could be more clearly situated within Aristotle's distinction between the potential and actual infinite. Schechtman is explicit that the potential infinite is really just a variable finite, while the indefinite is more than this insofar as it is "iteratively unlimited". Still, there is a sense in which the potential infinite is unlimited as well. If the indefinite is unlimited in a different sense, does it turn out to be actually infinite? That seems too strong, but some aspects of Schechtman's characterization push in this direction. More could be said about how these distinctions relate to one another.

On Leibniz's view, as Arthur develops it, the infinity of nature (but also that of mathematical entities) is actual, rather than potential. Take, for example, Leibniz's conception of the division of bodies: bodies are actually infinitely divided, not divisible. The same goes for a mathematical series: the series has actually infinitely many terms; it is not that the series can be extended to infinity, but that it already does extend. Still, Leibniz resists the implication either that there is an infinite number of bodies or an infinite number of terms. On Leibniz's syncategorematic conception of infinity, there are simply more bodies than any given number and more terms than any given number. Arthur has been defending this conception of infinity in Leibniz for some time, but in response to some recent attempts to assimilate Leibniz's mathematical conception of infinity to the Aristotelian potential infinite (by Herbert Breger, Fabio C. M. Bosinelli, and perhaps also Maria Rosa Antognazza), Arthur extends the syncategorematic, actual infinite to the case of mathematical entities as well. The result is a comprehensive picture of Leibniz's nuanced conception of infinity.

Melamed's paper is ostensibly concerned with refuting Jonathan Bennett's suggestion that by "infinitely many" Spinoza just means "all". On Bennett's view, when Spinoza says that God has "infinitely many attributes", he just means "all attributes", which is compatible with the view that there are only two (namely, thought and extension). I think this stated goal is certainly accomplished: Melamed provides strong textual grounds for the claim that, according to Spinoza, there are more than two attributes. But other aspects of Melamed's discussion are interesting in their own right, including the view that parallelism not only entails that minds don't causally interact with bodies, but also that ideas of minds don't causally interact with ideas of bodies. This claim is then applied to explain why even if there are attributes besides thought and extension we would not be able to know about them. This move is both intriguing and provocative: I was left wondering whether this really precludes the possibility of knowing other attributes (rather than merely the interaction between our ideas of thought, extension, and any unknown attribute), since we do, after all, have ideas of extension. Melamed refers the reader to some of his other work, which engages this issue more fully. Thus, Melamed's paper does more than simply refute Bennett's contention, but provides a variety of substantive interpretive claims about Spinoza's conception of infinity as well as his metaphysics more broadly.

Geoffrey Gorham and Paul Guyer engage Descartes and Kant (respectively) on the infinity of space and time. Gorham offers a novel assessment of the asymmetry between Descartes's treatment of the infinity of space and the infinity of time. The asymmetry is that while space and time are both indefinite for Descartes, time is only indefinite in one direction, having a moment of creation before which there was no time. Gorham's paper focuses largely on the indefinite extension of space, arguing that it is not grounded on considerations of size or quantity, but rather on the interdependence of the parts of extension. His suggestion helps to make sense of the asymmetry because the indefinite extension of space does not piggy-back on the indefinite increase of quantity (and thus need not extend to time), but is given by the fact that no part of extension can be conceived without conceiving all extension, i.e. an indefinite extent. (Not so for time, since each and every moment of our existence can be conceived independently of all the rest.) Gorham's suggestion is plausible, but has to reckon with the fact that Descartes also argues that each part of matter is really distinct from all others, which implies that each part of extension is independent of all the rest. Gorham engages this issue briefly by suggesting that parts of matter can be really distinct without being independent. However, I think this issue is thornier than Gorham suggests, since a real distinction only holds between substances and substances are characterized by Descartes as independent beings (independent of everything except God). More could be said along these lines in order to shore up Gorham's approach.

Guyer's paper connects nicely with a variety of the issues developed in earlier contributions, even though it is the only one on Kant. The paper is motivated by the idea in Kant that our representation of space as unlimited is immediately given in intuition. Guyer wants to press the idea that our representation of space as unlimited is in fact inferred from the fact that whatever space we envision however large is itself contained in a larger space -- in Guyer's words, is "delimited from a larger surrounding space" (187). Thus, our representation of space as unlimited requires the reiteration of what is immediately given in intuition, and thus requires reason. This observation is plausible, and Guyer argues that it has significant implications for our understanding of Kant. He applies this insight to challenge a recent interpretation of the structure of Kant's Transcendental Deduction given by Henry Allison -- or more precisely, to challenge the viability of Kant's position so understood. On Allison's reconstruction (as Guyer sees it), one crucial step of Kant's deduction is the move from the "unicity" of space and time, i.e. that any region of space or time must be represented as contained within a larger one, to the representation of space and time as synthetic unities, i.e. as totalities of all their parts. According to Guyer, this move is illicit: there is no synthesis of pure space and time to be had. He then applies this result to provide a novel interpretation of Kant's Transcendental Deduction. Despite its focus on issues internal to Kant, Guyer's paper connects to earlier ones, since it engages the issue of whether an infinite totality can be built up from parts (i.e. synthesized) and thus, more broadly, the question of priority between the infinite and the finite.

Igor Agostini engages Descartes's conception of God as an ens summe perfectum et infinitum. He helpfully links Descartes's identification of God's infinity and God's perfection to a scholastic debate about the formal reason for God's infinity. Though Agostini does not argue that Descartes sees himself as engaged in this debate, he suggests that Descartes's position would be a radical contribution to it: in particular, on Agostini's account, Descartes derives both God's infinity and God's perfection from God's aseity, namely the idea that God is self-caused. Agostini suggests that, in order to use this characteristic of God's nature to derive God's infinity, Descartes needs to hold a positive conception of aseity (i.e., self-caused) rather than a merely negative one (i.e., not caused by another). Agostini succeeds in displaying a certain trajectory from the scholastics to Descartes, which helps to clarify Descartes's own conception of the connection and origin of God's infinity and perfection, but does not take stock of scholastic precedents for Descartes's conception of aseity. This would have been a helpful addition, since there are arguably a variety of medieval thinkers (especially theologians) who have the positive conception of aseity that Agostini attributes to Descartes.

Mogens Lærke and Ohad Nachtomy trace different engagements between Leibniz and other early modern thinkers. Lærke's discussion is focused on a specific exchange between Leibniz and Régis (a Cartesian) concerning the issue of whether matter takes on all possible forms. Régis aims to defend Descartes's position against some objections that Leibniz had raised publicly: if Descartes in fact claims that matter takes on all possible forms, then his view quickly falls into Spinozistic necessitarianism, since there will be no unactualized possibilities. On Lærke's reconstruction, Régis's main approach is to distinguish all possible forms from an indefinite progression of forms: while the former might preclude any unrealized possibilities, the latter need not. Lærke then develops an approach that Leibniz could have used (but for some reason did not) to defeat Régis's attempt to exonerate Descartes from this charge. On Lærke's reading, Leibniz could have deployed his commitment to the actual infinity of nature to resist the characterization of the world as indefinite: to be actual is to be definite not indefinite. Lærke speculates that the reason Leibniz did not pursue this any further had to do with the optics of engaging in a "prolonged attack on the religion of Descartes" (128). I also think, though Lærke doesn't develop this idea explicitly, that Leibniz's conception of the actual infinity of nature provides a way out of the dilemma that Régis finds himself in, since on Leibniz's view a progression can be actually infinite without containing all possibles. Thus, were Leibniz to have deployed his conception of actual infinity, he would have in fact undercut the very problem he was levelling against Descartes.

Nachtomy traces various aspects of Leibniz's conception of infinity to his engagement with Galileo, Descartes, and Spinoza. On Nachtomy's reconstruction, Leibniz inherits different aspects of his considered position on the infinite from each of them. From Descartes, Leibniz inherits a positive commitment to the actual infinity of nature. (Even though Descartes wants to reserve the term "infinite" for God alone, Leibniz develops his conception of the actually infinite division of matter while reflecting on Descartes's engagement with the problem of motion in the plenum.) From Galileo, Leibniz inherits the impossibility of infinite number; from Spinoza, the distinction between quantitative and non-quantitative conceptions of infinity. While it is difficult to isolate these inheritances to the figures noted -- for example, Leibniz is clearly engaged with the issue of infinite number in some of the passages Nachtomy cites in relation to Descartes -- Nachtomy's project of distinguishing and highlighting the possible origin of different aspects of Leibniz's considered views about the infinite both is illuminating and helps make sense of the considered conception itself.

Sanja Särman's contribution is one of the few that moves beyond main-line metaphysics and engages with Spinoza's account of the passions. Her question concerns the viability of Spinoza's so-called "therapy of the passions". The idea, in brief, is this: on Spinoza's view, one of the ways to remove the grip that a certain passion has on us is to understand the object of the passion as necessitated by a series of finite causes. The problem is that the series of prior causes is actually infinite; therefore, this mode of therapy seems to require the synthesis of an actually infinite series. Särman's idea is that because this mode of therapy requires the synthesis of an actually infinite series, we must be capable of such a synthesis. I am intrigued, though I would like to see this aspect of Särman's account developed further. It seems that there are independent reasons to think that Spinoza would reject the possibility of synthesizing an infinite whole in this way -- in particular, of building an actual infinity from given parts. Though Särman rightly points out that, for Spinoza, thought about the infinite is not out of bounds for human beings, since, on Spinoza's view every idea contains an adequate idea of God in some way, that is different from the view that human beings can synthesize an actually infinite array into a single whole. More could be said about how the synthesis of an actually infinite chain of causes gets along with Spinoza's view that an actual infinity cannot be built up from parts.

Noa Schein engages the deduction of finite modes in Spinoza. Schein's paper is an outlier since it doesn't take up issues directly related to infinity. Rather, it concerns a related, epistemic issue: how do finite modes follow from infinite substance and how can this be understood by those finite modes themselves (namely, us humans). But as with many of the other papers, there is a deep question about the infinite at the heart of this issue: can infinite substance be built bottom-up, so to speak, or must finite modes be derived top-down? Which is prior, the finite or the infinite? Schein's suggestion is that in the case of our epistemic access there is no straightforward answer to this question; rather each "epistemic trajectory" constitutes part of the answer. Since we (as finite modes) find ourselves in a state of confusion, this needs to be overcome before any kind of top-down derivation is available: "Once we are successful in doing this, we can see without confusion that finite modes follow from the infinite substance top-down" (112). Thus, on Schein's view our epistemic trajectory is both bottom-up and top-down; the whole story comprises both trajectories.

In the end, this volume contains high-quality papers and is worth a look, both for specialists in early modern philosophy and for philosophers interested in this period of thought about infinity. There is some useful overlap (without too much repetition) between the different papers on each thinker and informative connections between thinkers emerge naturally as well. If I had to level one general criticism it would be this: given the richness of the topic of infinity and the depth of the early modern engagement with it, the papers cover mostly familiar themes in mostly familiar thinkers. Especially in light of the recent increase in attention to non-canonical philosophers among scholars of early modern philosophy, it would have been nice to see some engagement with less familiar personalities for whom the infinite also played a central role. (I'm thinking of people like Conway, du Châtelet, Galileo, who does at least make a brief appearance in Nachtomy's paper, and Pascal, whom the editors do mention in the introduction.) But listing names is easy, and one volume can't do everything. For specialists in the area, the topics and figures might be familiar, but these familiar topics are developed in novel ways. And for philosophers working in other areas, this collection provides a helpful introduction to the way in which infinity plays a central role in some of the major philosophical systems of the early modern period.


Benardete, José. Infinity: An Essay in Metaphysics. Oxford: Clarendon Press. 1964.