Infinity: New Research Frontiers

Placeholder book cover

Michael Heller and W. Hugh Woodin (eds.), Infinity: New Research Frontiers, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 311pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107003873.

Reviewed by John Mumma, Stanford University


The concept of the infinite seems to be at once irresistible and paradoxical, enthralling and sobering, mystical and mathematical. The questions that lead us to it are ones that a child could ask. Does space go on forever in all directions? Will time continue into the future without end? Did it ever begin? With any number one can count out to, one can always count out one more. Does that mean there are an infinite number of numbers?

Understood in terms of the specific concepts of space, time and number in which they are framed, these simple questions are ones for the physicist and mathematician. We could hope to find some answers (or a least a deeper understanding) in the far from simple theories of cosmology and set theory. At the same time, the questions can seem to derive from a single, general issue: the possibility of a limitless entity or reality beyond the limits of our human perspective. So framed, the question of the infinite is one for the metaphysician and/or the theologian.

The underlying premise of the book Infinity: New Research Frontiers, edited by Hugh Woodin and Michael Heller, is that both approaches to the infinite can fruitfully inform one another. A collection of articles on infinity by mathematicians, physicists, philosophers and theologians, the book originates from a similarly named 2006 conference organized by the Center for Theology and Natural Science (CTNS) and the John Templeton Foundation (JTF). Its contributors consist mainly of participants at the conference. The general mission of both CTNS and JTF is to explore and promote connections between scientific knowledge and the existential and spiritual issues that religion traditionally addresses.

This is reflected in the interdisciplinary make-up of the book. To the book's credit, the articles are not all directed towards discussing a single, putatively universal notion of the infinite. Instead, most authors concentrate on the particular notion arising in their particular field. Some, but not all, discuss the possible significance of their field's conception of the infinite to other fields. As the editors state in the preface, the aim is "to show the tension between different viewpoints and opinions" rather than presenting a series of conclusive positions. One is left to judge for oneself from the variety of disciplinary viewpoints if there can be productive interdisciplinary cross talk on the infinite. The book may not succeed at convincing all readers that this is the case, but at the very least one gains from the collection an appreciation of the richness and complexity of the concepts, questions and puzzles that cluster around the word.

Graham Oppy begins his article (chapter 11 of the book) by distinguishing, usefully, between the infinite as it relates to quantitative limits and bounds and the infinite as understood in a metaphysical sense, as "the ultimate source of everything." He observes that prima facie the latter notion, discussed by the theologian, has no relevance to the former notion as understood by the mathematician or physicist. If there is a significant connection between them, the direction of relevance would go the other way, from the mathematician's or physicist's conception to the theologian's. Oppy's point is borne out in the book's other articles. In them all, if a link between scientific and theological concepts is considered, it is always for the purpose of examining how, if at all, the scientific concepts bear on the theological ones.

The chapters fall into three groups: those concerning mathematical infinity, those concerning physical infinity, and those concerning infinity in theology. Save for the first chapter, the sequence of chapters respects this grouping; chapters 2-6 concern the infinite in mathematics, chapters 7-10 the infinite in physics, and chapters 11-14 the infinite in theology. The title of the first chapter, written by the theologian Wolfgang Achtner, is 'Infinity as a Transformative Concept in Science and Theology,' which suggests a comprehensive historical survey of the infinite in all the fields represented in the book. Yet the intellectual developments Achtner charts are confined to theology. Cantor is the only non-theologian discussed at length, and his revolutionary work is presented as a contribution to our conception of God as infinite. It would thus be better placed with the theological articles at the end of the book.

The chapters on the mathematical and physical infinite make good on the reference to research frontiers in the book's title. They contain a great deal of sophisticated technical details on the current state of knowledge of the infinite in mathematics and physics. In fact, two of the articles from the mathematical group (i.e., chapters 5 and 6) present definitions, theorems and proofs in the format of a mathematical textbook or journal article. Nevertheless, the expressed wish of the editors in the preface is that the chapters on the mathematics and physics of the infinite be of benefit not only to specialists but also to laymen who "are deeply interested" in the infinite and "are not afraid of intellectual challenge."

For this wish to be fulfilled, the high-level technical information needs to be situated somehow in a general, accessible picture of what motivates the question or questions concerning the infinite in the field. The layman would then be able to understand at least the relevance of the information and be in a position to prioritize the intellectual challenges he wants to take on. The chapters on the physics of the infinite are more successful in this respect than the chapters on the mathematics of the infinite. Motivating the issues that surround the mathematics of the infinite is of course more involved than motivating the physics of the infinite. The latter concerns the nature of space and time and so has an immediate, concrete relevance. Nevertheless, some account of the mathematical developments and pressures that led to the modern mathematical conception of the infinite is not beyond the scope of the book, and its absence is conspicuous.

Specifically, a reader without an appreciation of the supreme foundational importance of set theory to modern mathematics would not gain it from the five articles on the mathematics of the infinite. One would expect to find it in chapters 2 and 3, as these seem positioned to set the stage for the more mathematically sophisticated discussions in chapters 4 through 6. But in his historical survey (chapter 2), Enrico Bombieri expressly ignores foundational questions. Worse, he seems to align the rigorization of the calculus with a finitistic perspective. He emphasizes the affinity of the modern epsilon-delta definitions of limit, continuity and convergence to the Aristolelian notion of the potential infinite, but fails to mention that the standard foundational framework for these definitions is set theory, whereby the real numbers and functions on the real numbers are actually infinite objects. In his contribution (chapter 3), Edward Nelson does address foundational issues in taking a strong stance against the actual infinite. The objects of modern set theory are, to Nelson, a product of the human imagination. Yet Nelson fails to provide any hints as to why this product of the human imagination has entrenched itself so strongly in modern mathematics.

The general impression one gets from the book is that the set theoretic infinite is due solely to the genius of Cantor, in whose mind the transfinite burst into being ex nihilo. The picture fits with the theological leanings of the book (it lends itself well to the idea of divine revelation) but is, of course, an incomplete one. What is missing is a depiction of the mathematical context from which Cantor's work grew and the foundational role the work eventually came to play within it.

Judged on their own terms, chapters 2 and 3 offer informative, if in some respects unsatisfying, discussions of the infinite. Bombieri's aim in chapter 2 seems to be just to highlight places in ancient, early modern and contemporary mathematics where both the very, very large and the infinite have arisen. Relative to this aim, the chapter contains some useful and stimulating material. It also contains some philosophical reflections that are, at best, under-developed. In support of his stance against the actual infinite, Nelson in chapter 3 sketches in a lively, personable way the basic ideas behind his metamathematical investigations in his Predicative Arithmetic (without, oddly, citing the work for the reader). In particular, he characterizes in precise terms features that, arguably, distinguish addition and multiplication as epistemologically basic operations in arithmetic. But this is not enough to substantiate Nelson's final assertion that the absence of these features in other arithmetical operations (e.g., exponentiation) constitutes a "serious . . . warning sign of trouble in contemporary mathematics." In reading the chapter, one shares in Sam Buss's frustration (expressed in Buss 2006) over the extent to which Nelson gives clear reasons for his radical position.

Chapters 4 through 6, the book's other mathematical articles, treat topics on or close to the frontiers of research into the mathematical infinite. Woodin is the author of the first two of these articles, Harvey Friedman the author of the third. In contrast to the two preceding it, the articles are focused and dense. Each presents philosophically motivated mathematical results. In chapter 4, Woodin constructs a Gödel sentence in the service of a realist conception of set theory. The specific conclusion of the argument is that the relationship of consistency and meaningfulness in a theory of very large but finitely bounded sets is no different from the analogous relationship in the standard theory of infinite sets. In chapter 5 Woodin builds on a previously proven result about the undecidability of randomness in finite sequences of information with the goal of "illustrating a potentially subtle aspect of the distinction between determinism and non-determinism." Very roughly, Woodin's mathematical result is: a Turing program e0* exists such that its set of possible inputs is finite and for any possible output t a non-standard model of Peano arithmetic exists in which e0*computes t as output. Chapter 6 is the first publication of a research program Friedman has developed termed concept calculus, whose general goal is to explore in precise terms the relationship between our everyday common sense notions and the mind-bending infinities of mathematics.  Friedman gives the many details behind some mutual interpretability results concerning ZFC set theory and some related first-order theories intended to capture the common sense notions of 'better than' and 'much better than.'

The mathematical exposition of each of these results is clear (at least to someone with some background in mathematical logic). One wishes, however, that Woodin and Friedman spent more time fleshing out the interpretation of the precise formal concepts that their theorems directly concern. With respect to the argument of chapter 5, for instance, it is not obvious (to this reader at least) how physical time and physical laws should be understood in terms of Peano arithmetic. Also, whether Friedman's formalization actually captures the everyday notions of 'better than' and 'much better than' or an idealization thereof seems to be a question open for discussion. In any event, Woodin's and Friedman's mathematical results merit the attention of any philosopher interested in the issues they address.

Both chapters 5 and 6 are centered on the mathematical results they contain. The scope of Woodin's chapter 4 is on the other hand much wider. He describes the subtle technical issues surrounding the project of developing a satisfactory mathematical realization of a realist conception of sets. Woodin's discussion is extended, detailed and advanced. He jumps quickly into the complex dialectic involving large cardinal axioms, forcing, the multiverse view of set theory, his omega conjecture and the inner model program. Those who have little background in set theory and wish to understand in general terms the way philosophy and mathematics intertwine in the field ought to look elsewhere. The article is, however, valuable to the philosopher of mathematics and the philosophically minded mathematician, in that it presents the current perspective of a foremost authority on the mathematical infinite.

In each of the chapters on the physical infinite, the authors relate how areas of theoretical physics in which they have worked bear on classical questions concerning space and time. Though the discussion is at times advanced, the general ideas are accessible to anyone familiar with the idea of a simultaneity slice. Carlo Rovelli in chapter 7 discusses how with quantum gravity a model where space is discrete (i.e., not infinitely divisible) is a live option in theoretical physics. Anthony Aguirre in chapter 8 guides the reader through a dizzying landscape of inflationary vacuum energy and bubble universes to survey where infinity pops up in current cosmological models. Marco Bersanelli in chapter 9 explains the kinds of astronomical data relevant to the question of whether or not the universe is spatially infinite. And Heller in chapter 10 reviews theoretical work on singularities in general relativity to illustrate how the infinite, as a meaningful scientific concept, ought to be understood.

This does not exhaust the topics treated in the articles on the physical infinite. A wealth of information is given, for a variety of ends. The author who is the most open to the idea of an infinite universe in spatial or temporal extent is Aguirre. His detailed and challenging discussion of recent work in cosmology has the aim of showing how current physical theory implies, or at least points to, an infinite universe. Rovelli's less detailed and less challenging discussion has the opposing aim of laying out the scientific support for a finite universe. Bersanelli argues, thoroughly, against the empirical verifiability of an infinite universe. And Heller dismisses the idea that the infinite in cosmology is something "very, very, very . . . big" and urges that talk of the infinite be confined to what has been brought under mathematical control. In contrast to the other three authors, Aguirre more or less sticks to the physics bearing on the question of the infinite; Rovelli, Bersanelli, and Heller supplement their exposition of theoretical concepts with some philosophical and/or theological reflections. Though there are some stimulating ideas suggested in these reflections, the articles would on a whole be stronger if they were closer in approach to Aguirre's.

The final section of the book on the infinite in theology opens with Oppy's article. He surveys from the perspective of contemporary analytic philosophy various difficulties connected to the idea of an infinite God. These include: the knowability of divine attributes, how God ought to be understood as infinite with respect to properties varying in degree, and the very consistency of the idea of an infinite God. Oppy's discussion is informed and careful. For the analytic philosopher interested in theological questions the article provides many questions to work on.

The book's remaining three chapters approach God and the infinite from the tradition of Christian theology. The general issue addressed by each is how, if at all, God's infinity is a positive idea -- i.e., not just an idea understood negatively as without bound or limit. Lurking nearby is a deeper, existential problem confronting any individual with theistic religious convictions: how can God, a being of vast and supreme greatness, be understood and known by a limited and imperfect being? In his erudite, highly readable contribution (chapter 12), David Bentley Hart begins by sharply distinguishing between the mathematical and metaphysical infinite. He then goes on to trace -- starting with the pre-Socrates and ending with Heidegger -- the development and (to him regrettable) decline of the positive conception of the metaphysical infinite in Western thought. In opposition to Hart, Robert John Russell in chapter 13 aims to bring the mathematical infinite to bear on the metaphysical. He proposes in particular that we look to set theory for a solution to the puzzles surrounding the positive knowability of God's infinite nature. Finally, in chapter 14 Denys A. Turner argues against the positive knowability of God's infinite nature while maintaining that such knowability is not required for "the intimacy of the divine immanence to creatures." The three articles sit well together. To a reader unfamiliar with the contours of the issue of infinity in Christian theology (as this reader was), the articles provide an engaging and informative introduction.

Though the quality of these chapters is not always present in the chapters preceding it, the book as a whole does have its rewards. The chapters taken together succeed at bringing into sharper focus the variety of ways the human mind has grappled and continues to grapple with the concept of infinity. The exposition in some chapters is awkward (this is most trivially but conspicuously instanced by a number of typographical errors spread throughout the book). In some places, philosophical discussion is too thin; in others it could be made tighter. What recommends the book is the amount of expert information it contains. One can learn from it a great deal about the way mathematicians, physicists and theologians are confronting the infinite in their work.


S. Buss. Nelson's work on logic and foundations and other reflections on the foundations of mathematics. Diffusion, Quantum Theory, and Radically Elementary Mathematics (W, Farris, editor), pp. 183-208, Princeton University Press, 2006.

E. Nelson. Predicative Arithmetic. Princeton University Press, 1986.