Information and Meaning in Evolutionary Processes

Placeholder book cover

William F. Harms, Information and Meaning in Evolutionary Processes, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 280pp, $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521815142.

Reviewed by Samir Okasha, University of Bristol


This ambitious book, a new addition to the Cambridge Studies in Philosophy and Biology series, is described by its author as a work of "evolutionary epistemology". This description is apt for some of what the book contains, but not all: many chapters do not engage with epistemological issues as usually understood, dealing instead with topics in philosophy of biology and evolutionary theory which Harms thinks may have downstream implications for epistemology. The book is organized into three parts. Part I, 'Generalizing Evolutionary Theory', consists of a critical discussion of the 'memetic' approach to cultural evolution advocated by Richard Dawkins and Daniel Dennett. Part II, 'Modeling Information Flow in Evolutionary Processes' deals with replicator dynamics and the role of the concept of information in evolution. Part III, 'Meaning Conventions and Normativity', argues that the normative dimension of traditional epistemology does not prevent it from being naturalized by empirical science, received philosophical wisdom notwithstanding.

The quality of the book is highly varied. In places the discussion is insightful, but all too often Harms formulates his arguments with insufficient clarity and the thread gets lost; at his worst, he is very hard to follow. The book contains a fair amount of technical material which, though competently done, is rarely doing any real philosophical work. Despite his obvious technical skills, I found Harms' treatment of evolutionary theory confused in a number of respects, detailed below. These criticisms notwithstanding, the book has some merits; in particular, Harms deserves credit for making a serious attempt to explain how information theory relates to evolution.

In his first two chapters Harms criticises the concept of a replicator, believed by many to be a key foundational concept in Darwinian theory, and in particular the notion of a meme. (Recall that in The Selfish Gene, Dawkins (1976) argued that the Darwinian process is at root a process of differential replication, that genes are the paradigmatic replicators, but that memes, i.e. ideas and concepts, may qualify as well.) Some of Harms' criticisms -- that it is unclear what exactly what a meme is, unclear how to individuate memes, unclear how to make 'memetics' into a serious science, and unclear why the meme story should be preferred to models of evolution which simply permit cultural as well as genetic transmission -- are well taken if not especially original. (Laland and Brown's book Sense and Nonsense (2003) makes all of these points.) Others of Harms' criticisms strike me as, frankly, bizarre, in particular his insistence that the cell is the entity that should be accorded the role in evolutionary theory that Dawkins and his followers accord to the replicator. The oddity of this idea is that cells are highly complex, functionally organized entities, themselves the product of Darwinian evolution. To argue, as Harms does, that our conceptualization of natural selection must start with the cell rather than the replicator leaves unexplained the question of how cells came into existence in the first place. Given that this question has a Darwinian answer, Harms' proposal is guilty of putting the cart before the horse.

Having disposed of memetics, Harms goes on to present his own account of how Darwinian theory should be applied to culture; this turns out to be a version of replicator dynamics similar to that used by Brian Skyrms in his recent books. Harms is surely right that this approach is more fruitful than memetics, but I found his discussion slightly unusual. Part of the problem lies in the way Harms understands the basic Darwinian concepts of selection, variation, and heredity. On the usual understanding, evolution by natural selection requires that the members of a population vary with respect to a trait, that different variants leave different numbers of offspring, and that the trait be transmitted from parents to offspring. So variation, with respect to both trait and fitness, is a precondition for the operation of natural selection. Strangely, however, Harms regards variation as an independent source of evolutionary change, that complements selection. He says that "evolution may be the result of selection, variation, or both" (p. 107), that "variation can cause the evolution of a population in the absence of selective forces" (p. 94), and that if immigration into a population alters its composition, "variation" has caused evolutionary change (p. 95). This conception of variation is unorthodox to say the least. Also unorthodox is Harms' understanding of multilevel selection. By this he does not mean the well-known body of theory used by D. S. Wilson, R. Michod and others to explain the evolution of co-operative groups from individuals; I found it hard to understand what he does mean by it. His understanding of adaptive landscapes is also at odds with the customary treatment of this concept in biology.

The core of Part 2 of the book consists of a discussion of information theory, its possible uses in naturalistic epistemology, and its relation to evolution. Harms offers an accessible guide to the basics of information theory itself, deftly distinguishes four different concepts of information, explains why information theory cannot help us understand them all, and briefly discusses Drestke's work on indicator semantics; this is the part of his book that I found most useful, in particular chapter 4. Harms concludes, rightly I believe, that information theory has a "quite modest" role to play in epistemology (p. 132). Nonetheless, he goes on to argue that natural selection should be thought of as an "information transfer" process, and that this can help us, somehow, with understanding traditional philosophical scepticism.

In evolutionary discussions one frequently encounters the idea that natural selection involves the transfer, or in some versions the accumulation, of information, or genetic information. For example, in their recent book on niche-construction, Odling-Smee, Laland and Feldman (2003) talk of natural selection leading to a "flow of semantic information though ecosystems". The rationale for using informational language to describe Darwinian evolution is not always clear; nor is it always clear what concept of information is being appealed to in such claims. To Harms' credit, his defence of natural-selection-as-information-transfer is clear about what 'information' means, namely covariation between the states of one system and those of another, as per standard information theory. His guiding idea is that an evolving population, as its composition is altered by natural selection, acquires information about its environment; this means, in effect, that the state of the population tracks the state of the environment. So the environment is the 'sender' and the population the 'receiver'; the 'transfer of information' from the former to the latter means simply that the variants the environment deems fitter increase in frequency in the population. Harms then proves a theorem showing that, given certain assumptions, the total amount of information in the system will always increase by natural selection; this theorem forms the heart of his chapter 5.

Harms' theorem invites comparison with R. A. Fisher's famous 'fundamental theorem' of natural selection, which asserts, roughly, that the mean fitness of a population will always increase by natural selection (Fisher 1930). Harms himself notes the analogy between his result and Fisher's, but I was unconvinced by what he says. He notes, correctly, that natural selection can sometimes drive average fitness down -- which seems to contradict Fisher. (The contradiction is only apparent, as I explain in a moment). Harms concludes, as have many others, that Fisher's theorem only holds true under certain assumptions, and is thus of limited interest. He then moves on to his own theorem about informational increase; one of the assumptions used in the proof is that fitnesses are fixed. To pre-empt the objection that this assumption greatly compromises the theorem's generality, Harms writes: "the proof indicates that at each instant, while fitnesses are fixed, the force of selection is driving information up. If fitnesses change as a result of population frequencies or external factors, then strictly speaking there is a new environmental state to track … to say that selection is an information-transfer process is not to say that there is no other force opposing or compromising it" (p. 145, emphasis in original). Thus the generality of his theorem is not compromised by the fixed fitness assumption, Harms concludes.

This is an interesting line of argument; what Harms does not realise is that it has a precedent in Fisher himself. Contrary to what is often thought, Fisher knew perfectly well that selection did not always lead the population mean fitness to increase. His theorem was not about the total change in mean fitness, but rather the change in mean fitness due to natural selection operating in a constant environment (cf. Price 1972, Frank and Slatkin 1992, Edwards 1994). Like Harms in the quotation above, Fisher argued that when selection changes gene frequencies, this itself constitutes a change in the environment; so the total change in mean fitness is affected by two causal factors: natural selection and environmental change. The direct effect of selection is always to increase the mean fitness; it is just that this increase may be offset by environmental 'deterioration' -- as in cases of frequency-dependent fitness. On this understanding, which is what Fisher intended though did not always explicitly state, the fundamental theorem is a universal truth. Harms makes a move precisely analogous to Fisher's to salvage the generality of his theorem, i.e. invoking environmental change whenever frequencies have changed. This is perfectly legitimate; but Harms cannot then claim, as he does, that Fisher's theorem is "of relatively little interest", given that the mean fitness does not always increase, while his own result is a highly general one (p. 143). This is simply double standards; the dialectical move which Harms uses to salvage the generality of his result is the very move that Fisher used to salvage the generality of his. Harms' result is no more general than Fisher's.

Leaving aside the technical details of Harms' theorem, what are its epistemological implications, if any? So far as I could understand, Harms wants to bring his theorem to bear on epistemology in roughly the following way. The classical problem of epistemology is to explain how knowledge of the external world is possible, i.e. how the mind can come to possess accurate representations of the world beyond it. Many great philosophical minds have grappled with this problem over the centuries, with varying degrees of success. Harms believes that evolutionary theory can supply the solution, in broad outline at least, given that selection involves the transfer of information. His theorem shows that natural selection will always lead a population to accumulate information, i.e. to 'learn', about its environment. So over time, the environment will come to leave an imprint on the population of organisms which is adapting to it; thus solving the problem of how knowledge of the external world is possible.

How convincing is this line of argument? The main problem with it, I think, is that the notion of information at work in Harms' theorem has relatively little, if anything, to do with the notion of representation in terms of which the traditional problem of the external world is usually stated. 'Information', for Harms, just means covariation, and natural selection involves 'information transfer' from environment to population only in the sense that changes in the population's composition depend on how well the different variants perform in the environment. So any evolving population 'learns' about its environment, in Harms' sense, even if the population is composed of organisms that lack minds entirely, hence lack the ability to have representations of the external world at all. In short, acquiring information about the environment in Harms' sense is easy; so easy that it is hard to believe that it provides a good model for the problem of acquiring knowledge about the world that epistemologists have traditionally grappled with. Coupled with the fact that the entity doing the 'acquiring' is different in the two cases -- a population in the first case, an organism in the second -- one cannot help doubting whether Harms' account of selection as information transfer really has the epistemological import he believes. In his defence, it should be noted that he never claims to have taken more than a first step, and that even first steps in a new area are difficult to take.


Dawkins, R. (1976) The Selfish Gene, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Edwards, A. W. F. (1994) 'The Fundamental Theorem of Natural Selection', Biological Reviews 69, 443-74.

Fisher, R. A. (1930) The Genetical Theory of Natural Selection, Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Frank, S. and Slatkin, M. (1992) 'Fisher's Fundamental Theorem of Natural Selection', Trends in Ecology and Evolution 7, 92-5.

Laland, K. and Brown, G. (2002) Sense and Nonsense, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Odling-Smee, J., Laland, K. and Feldman, M. (2003) Niche-Construction: The Neglected Process in Evolution, Princeton: Princeton University Press.

Price, G. (1972) 'Fisher's 'Fundamental Theorem' Made Clear', Annals of Human Genetics 36, 129-40.