Information Technology and Moral Philosophy

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Jeroen van den Hoven and John Weckert (eds.), Information Technology and Moral Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 415pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521855495.

Reviewed by Laurinda B. Harman, Temple University


The intersection of information technology and moral philosophy is of great importance. Given the power of information technology, these academic and application areas of expertise cannot exist in separate silos. Van den Hoven and Weckert have brought together experts who help us to understand the theory and practice and the past, present and future considerations of technological systems that require moral guidance in design and utilization. The focus on technology and human relationships increases ethical imperatives because what is done, how it is done and what the intended (and sometimes unintended) outcomes are must be carefully examined. This book brings information technology and moral philosophy out of the mountain-top retreats into the world of work.

These discussions could be unfathomable and hidden behind complex jargon for both disciplines. The chapter authors have had the moral courage to address important questions and readers will find their essays understandable and provocative and could often respond with "that is a great way to frame this problem." Whether you define yourself as an academician, practitioner, scholar-practitioner or student, and regardless of your years of experience, you will find this book to be informative and thought-provoking. Clinicians, researchers, educators, philosophers, ethicists, information technology experts, social scientists, politicians, religious and spiritual leaders and many others will be challenged and informed by the content of this book.

The book explores a myriad of topics: freedom, equality, metaphysics, genetics, neuroscience, nanotechnology, public policy, information ethics, transnational and global ethics, the intersection of the internet and human relationships, moral agency of computer systems, intellectual property and privacy, technology and values, and information justice, to name a few. If you are attracted to the title of this book, you are guaranteed exposure to thought-provoking analyses.

Terrell Ward Bynum ("Norbert Wiener and the Rise of Information Ethics") frames the roles of science, technology, ethics and information ethics, from historical and current perspectives, noting that we are dependent on information processing. Bynum addresses issues raised by cybernetics. He points out that a social and ethical revolution is occurring and that we must consider the implications of computers as potential moral agents. We are proceeding without a policy; Bynum urges us to consider the risks this entails.

James H. Moor ("Why We Need Better Ethics for Emerging Technologies") considers how best to answer the question posed by the title of his essay. He suggests that we cannot continue using past modes of inquiry given the emergence of genetic technologies (which are employed in developing food and medicine, and which introduce changes to biological life), nanotechnology (which makes use of material malleability to produce protective films and biosensors) and neurotechnology (which is used, for example, in brain scanning and pharmaceutical treatments). Moor asks whether society and public policy are ready to cope with these realities. Computers are changing how we work, interact with others, communicate and use our bodies and minds. Moral philosophy and ethical principles will be essential in the context of building new bodies, minds and environments. Moor recognizes that while it would be better if ethical deliberations preceded technological interventions, that is a luxury we do not have. So he encourages proactive interdisciplinary collaboration.

In "Information Ethics: Its Nature and Scope", Luciano Floridi classifies the emergence of information ethics (IE) as ontocentric, patient-oriented and ecological. He argues that we need an ethic of creative stewardship for the present and future. And he goes on to discuss biocentric ethics as it deals with life and suffering, moral agency, and moral responsibility.

James Bohman ("The Transformation of the Public Sphere: Political Authority, Communicative Freedom, and Internet Publics") identifies the risks and benefits of public space, including the role of politics, the legal system and economic authorities. He suggests that the public sphere, through Internet capabilities, requires transnational policies that "have to look for ways in which to distribute the processes of popular control and influence across institutional structures and levels" (72).

Cass R. Sunstein continues the exploration of the Internet in "Democracy and the Internet" and argues that it is a "great boon" for democracy, holding far more promise than risk. He considers the risks and benefits of group polarization and social cascades. While recognizing that knowledge is power, Sunstein suggests that a free republic and the capacities of the Internet are compatible.

Alvin I. Goldman ("The Social Epistemology of Blogging") takes the discussion of the Internet’s capabilities in another direction: blogging. Blogging, a collective enterprise, is a source of news and journalism for many, and is created without the benefit of peer review and filtering. Goldman asks whether words on the computer screen are considered 'truth' by the public, and if so, what the implications of this are in the long run.

In "Plural Selves and Relational Identity: Intimacy and Privacy Online", Dean Cocking explores identities and relationships that are formed, with speed and anonymity, across global boundaries. He points out that the individual can decide who to let in and who to exclude from identities and relationships. The ability to form close relationships is challenged, given that a person can insulate the private self from observation, judgment and interpretation by others -- inherent outcomes of face-to-face relationships.

Steve Mathews ("Identity and Information Technology") continues the discussion about identity in the technological world through an exploration of Internet communication and cyborgisation. Humans are informational agents and the Internet eliminates the power of embodiment. Mathews argues for the importance of embodiment (one of the anchors for values) and self- or character-identity in the public sphere. He notes that "if IT affects the way others see me, especially in virtue of the ways it alerts various modes of social communication, then it will come to affect the way I see myself" (144). This raises the question: is the degree of control over identity, in the context of IT communication, increased or decreased?

Philip Pettit ("Trust, Reliance, and the Internet") explores trust and reliance for Internet communication and argues that there are limitations. Can we trust those we communicate with in the electronic world, people with whom we don't have face-to-face encounters, who are outside personal, human relationships and identities? Telepresence is increasing. Only time will tell how trust might change in the support of human relationships that emerge through Internet communication systems.

Geoffrey Brennan and Philip Pettit ("Esteem, Identifiability, and the Internet") expand the discussion of human persona and the Internet through the screens of esteem and identifiability. Brennan and Pettit examine e-identity and e-reputations and contend that the emerging virtual space dynamics will be very similar to interactions that occur face-to-face.

In an essay of particular importance for researchers, and students who aspire to become researchers, Charles Ess ("Culture and Global Networks: Hope for a Global Ethics?") addresses global research ethics. He points to important differences around the world on positions about issues of privacy and control (or lack of control) over personal information, autonomy, informed consent and the risks of informational research. Ess proposes that a global ethics is possible, albeit difficult, given the realities of different cultural traditions.

Seumas Miller ("Collective Responsibility and Information and Communication Technology") ups the ante with a discussion of collective moral responsibility -- both acts of commission and omission -- in the context of global problems such as the environment and poverty. Miller explores the use of communication technology in the collection, storage and retrieval of knowledge to help solve these problems. He argues that large databases and sophisticated data- mining capabilities increase our moral responsibility for making decisions. Miller provides an important analysis of intentionality, truth, values and responsibility for actions.

Deborah G. Johnson and Thomas M. Powers ("Computers As Surrogate Agents") pursue the question "could computers, computer programs and robots be considered moral agents?". While this is a future-based question, it is one that deserves exploration. If computers were to have human characteristics, intelligence, and consciousness, or were able to perform rational or intentional acts, how would humans respond to the good and evil outcomes those computers would generate? (I was reminded of HAL in 2001: A Space Odyssey: "Open the bay hatch door, HAL." "I'm sorry, I can't do that Dave.") Johnson and Powers consider the problems of incompetency and intentional wrong-doing we would face were computers moral agents. They argue that surrogate agency is a model that we can apply and they explore existing examples of agency.

Wendy J. Gordon ("Moral Philosophy, Information Technology, and Copyright") examines the Grokster Case, a Supreme Court copyright case involving a decentralized peer-to-peer technology process that allows copying and distribution of music, in violation of copyright law.

Jeroen van den Hoven ("Information Technology, Privacy, and the Protection of Personal Data") discusses the risks and benefits of collecting, using and disseminating personal information, across a continuum (financial, clinical, consumer systems and the like). Electronic Health Record (EHR) systems are being implemented throughout the country and this chapter will be of particular interest to those developing and managing these systems. Van den Hoven asks whether, although there is moral justification for the right to privacy, privacy can be preserved when electronic systems are implemented. He explores legal, practical, technical and political issues in light of the desire for personal information by the government, commercial entities, employers, healthcare systems and the like. Van den Hoven writes that "It may well be the case that given the prominence and importance of identity management technology, RFID technology, profiling and data mining, and genetic profiling, we need to have a new look at the dominant referential interpretation of personal data" (310). He asks whether we can build systems that are just and prevent harm or exploitation, inequality or discrimination. If not, privacy protection has become an oxymoronic phrase.

Mary Flanagan, Daniel C. Howe and Helen Nissenbaum ("Embodying Values in Technology: Theory and Practice") ask us to think about designing value-based systems. They consider a case study, RAPUNSEL, "a large multidisciplinary collaboration aimed at designing and implementing an experimental game prototype to promote interest and competency in computer programming among girls of middle-school age, including girls from disadvantaged home environments" (331). They conclude that this research project demonstrates that values can be incorporated in the design process.

Dag Elgesem ("Information Technology and Research Ethics") considers the ethical implications of manipulating or changing the genetic code of living beings and of nanotechnology and robotics. (Once again, the past’s "science fiction" is recognizable in present day reality.) Elgesem explores the role of values in research design and the values and obligations of the researcher (e.g., how do we proceed knowing that research subjects can be harmed?). He also assesses the role of ethics for artificial intelligence researchers.

Jeroen van den Hoven and Emma Rooksby ("Distributive Justice and the Value of Information: A (Broadly) Rawlsian Approach") analyze access to and availability of information on both national and global levels. They point to underlying factors, including the impact of poverty, the level of literacy, the lack of access to technology, and the availability of educational interventions. They also note that an argument can be made that access to information is a Rawlsian primary good.

I thoroughly enjoyed reading this book. It helps better frame our understanding of the power of emerging technologies, a power that increases our moral responsibility for the decisions that are to be made not just for ourselves but for others, including those in future generations. A new M.S. in Health Informatics program will start at Temple University next year, and this text will be on our booklist for those students. I look forward to the dialogue that van den Hoven and Weckert's book will generate.