Ingmar Bergman, Cinematic Philosopher: Reflections on His Creativity

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Irving Singer, Ingmar Bergman, Cinematic Philosopher: Reflections on His Creativity, MIT Press, 2007, 240pp., $24.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780262195638.

Reviewed by Thomas E. Wartenberg, Mount Holyoke College


The title of Irving Singer's book, Ingmar Bergman, Cinematic Philosopher, promises more than the book itself delivers. From the book's title, one might expect, as I did, that Singer would be presenting an account of Bergman's oeuvre that linked the great director's films to the project of philosophy. After all, as Singer himself tells us, Bergman's films have sometimes been seen "as an expression of modern existentialism," (p. 115) a view that Singer admits has some truth to it. Even a casual viewer of Bergman's films can register their relationship to philosophy because of their concern with such issues as the significance of death, the possibility of faith, and questions about the meaning of life. This would suggest that there is a connection between Bergman's central cinematic concerns and those of at least one important twentieth-century school of philosophy. As a result, one might anticipate that Singer, a philosopher himself and author of numerous philosophic texts on such issues as love and the meaning of life, would explore these connections in some detail. But if one approaches Singer's book with expectations such as these, one is bound to be disappointed, for Singer does not intend to explore the possibility that Bergman's films have a special relationship to the discipline of philosophy. Singer does make this aspect of his approach very clear from the outset. He explains that he sees Bergman as a filmmaker who has developed "a mode of intellectual probing and penetration that seems to me clearly philosophical, though not the same as specialized investigations that belong to philosophy proper." (p. 3) In fact, in this respect, Singer takes Bergman's films to be continuous with those of such filmmakers as Alfred Hitchcock, Orson Welles, and Jean Renoir, the three filmmakers who were the subject of his earlier book, Three Philosophical Filmmakers: Hitchcock, Welles, Renoir. His text is thus studded with comparisons between these four very different filmmakers, as well as with references to Preston Sturges, an unexpected point of comparison for Bergman. Interesting as these comparisons are, they tend to make it difficult to see how exceptional Bergman really was as a filmmaker and to assess the question of whether there was something especially philosophical about Bergman's cinematic preoccupations.

The book that Singer has written presents an account of Bergman as an auteur, that is, as a filmmaker with a set of broad intellectual concerns that he embodies in his films over the course of a long career. Among the concerns that Singer presents Bergman as wrestling with are the nature of childhood and its impact on adulthood, the magical nature of film, the possibility of faith, and the ambiguities of human relationships. Although these are issues that can be raised in philosophically interesting ways, Singer does not address the relationship between Bergman's posing of them and their presence within the discipline of philosophy itself. This is, of course, because he does not think that Bergman's films are philosophical in anything other than their reflectiveness.

An oddity of Singer's approach is that he seems no more inclined to treat Bergman's cinematic reflections as specifically philosophical than he does the other filmmakers he has written about. But questions about the viability of religious faith in the modern world, about the significance of God's apparent absence from the world, about whether one can find meaning in a life that ends in death conceived of as complete annihilation, about whether romantic love is truly possible, etc. -- the sorts of questions that obsessed Bergman both in his life and in his highly personal films -- seem clearly philosophical, something that any fan of his films notices. The question that I would have been interested in seeing Singer explore is whether Bergman's manner of asking and answering these questions in his films justifies us in seeing his films as philosophy in any stronger sense than that they raise these questions that philosophers also explore.

After all, there is a growing body of film interpretation by philosophers that makes stronger claims about the possibility of cinematic philosophy. Although some philosophers and film theorists object to the idea of films being or doing philosophy, others have defended such a possibility, often by showing how a specific film raises a philosophic question, gives a counter-example to a philosophical thesis, or even presents a philosophical view of its own. I was disappointed that Singer did not address this issue at all, for it makes his book of significantly less relevance for philosophers who are interested in the possibility of cinematic philosophy or, to refer once more to Singer's title, cinematic philosophers. Given Singer's intimate knowledge of Bergman's output and his skill as a philosopher, this seems like a genuine lost opportunity.

For one of the things that Singer does establish is that Bergman was a filmmaker who used his films to work through a range of issues that he faced as a human being. Beginning with a more traditional religious outlook, according to which life can have meaning only in relation to the existence of God, Bergman developed a more humanistic outlook that saw meaning in one's relations to other human beings, especially those one loves, despite the fraught nature that such relationships often have. More than other filmmakers, Bergman seems to have been able to use the medium of film as a means for developing his own private reflection about life, albeit in a very public form, one that offered others a glimpse into one human being's genuine and persistent attempt to develop solutions to the intellectual issues that haunted him. Although Bergman's concerns had their source in his own biography -- a religious but remote father, a mother whose love he did not trust -- he was able to develop a cinematic form through which others could relate to those issues and see them also at play in their own lives.

Singer does not see all of Bergman's films as equally interesting philosophically speaking. The ones that he keeps coming back to are The Seventh Seal, Wild Strawberries, and Persona. These are actually films that I have taught and that seem to me to deserve to be considered as potential candidates for the designation of cinematic philosophy. Among them, Singer regards Persona as Bergman's greatest cinematic accomplishment, and this seems to me a plausible judgment. As he points out, not only does the film push Bergman's investigations about the nature of the human being to new depths through his use of extreme close ups of his protagonists' faces, but the film also insistently dwells on its own character as a film. So it's surprising to find Singer failing to discuss the amazing sequence in which the film appears to destroy itself, as if its witnessing of the cruelty that human beings are capable of manifesting in relation to one another makes art impossible, thus reflecting in its own terms the central character's dilemma of how to go on in the face of our inability to lift ourselves out of ethically compromising situations. And since the nature of human cruelty is thus one of the topics that Bergman deals with cinematically, I would have liked to see Singer presenting a more compelling discussion of how Bergman treats this issue and whether his attention to it is something that philosophers ought to take notice of.

Singer does offer a variety of highly interesting perspectives on Bergman's films. I was particularly interested in his account of the impact that Bergman's work in the theater had on his filmmaking. Singer suggests that Bergman was able to develop a specifically theatrical form of the cinema that no other filmmaker has equaled because, among other things, he conceived of film as an art form that could embody theatricality in a distinctive manner. Equally interesting are his comments on the relationship between music and Bergman's films. A filmmaker who developed an innovative means of bringing opera to the silver screen in Ingmar Bergman's The Magic Flute is bound to have thought deeply about the role that music would play in his films. So not only do Bergman's soundtracks abound with pieces by his favorite composer, J. S. Bach, but, Singer tells us, Bergman thought of his films in musical terms. As a result, the films are attempts to embody a different emotional register than traditional films generally had. Conceiving of his films on analogy with musical works, Bergman attempted to give each scene a distinctive mood, one that his use of music would help to establish. As I have said, I found Singer's discussion of the relationship between Bergman's films and these two other art forms genuinely informative and very helpful in thinking about Bergman's achievement as a filmmaker.

So despite being disappointed by the absence of a sustained discussion of why Bergman should be seen as a cinematic philosopher, I found this to be a useful book. Because of his familiarity with Bergman's films and his writings, Singer is able to show us how a great filmmaker pursued a range of concerns and developed his answers to them in films made over the course of a lifetime. Given Bergman's recent death, it is particularly fitting that Singer's book appear at this time, for it can help remind us of the distinctive contribution that this great cinematic philosopher made to his chosen art form.