Injustice and the Reproduction of History: Structural Inequalities, Gender and Redress

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Alasia Nuti, Injustice and the Reproduction of History: Structural Inequalities, Gender and Redress, Cambridge University Press, 2019, 229pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108419949.

Reviewed by David Lyons, Boston University


Most white Americans summarily dismiss reparations claims on behalf of African Americans. As calls for reparations often refer to slavery, critics may observe that slavery ended a long time ago and that none of the former slaves or slave owners are alive today -- thereby ignoring connections between the distant past and the present, such as Jim Crow and persisting racial stratification. Or they may overestimate (or simply exaggerate) the corrective impact of twentieth century civil rights legislation. At the same time a number of theorists, white as well as black, take the reparations issue seriously.1 Alasia Nuti believes, however, that current approaches to the issue have serious defects, and she offers a new theory, which sees the past and the present linked inextricably by "historical structures."

Nuti then applies her theory to the situation of women -- much neglected by the literature on historical injustice. She reasonably claims that women are a paradigm example of the kind of social group to which her theory is meant to apply -- members of which continue to be subjected to systematic wrongs, including serious violence, despite their societies' endorsing formal equality. Nuti offers many sound observations about the position of women and sensitive suggestions about corrective policies. I refrain here from commenting further on applications of her theory to the case of women as I believe it most important in this brief review to focus on her general theory.

Here are the problems that Nuti wishes her theory to overcome. Some theorists who are critical of reparations claims argue that such acts as European settlers' seizure of indigenous land are "superseded" by the choices that have been made by individuals over the many intervening years, which make it impossible to ascribe current disadvantages to specific acts in the distant past. Nuti believes this objection fails because, she says, the past is not something separate but "is reproduced in the present." Given the theory she develops, I believe this means that in repairing current inequities we can also address past injustices. I agree with Nuti here, but I will raise some questions about her view of the connections between past and present.

Some critical theorists argue that African American descendants of slaves (the principal focus of the reparations literature) cannot validly claim to be disadvantaged by their ancestors' condition because the slave trade accounts for the descendants' very existence Nuti believes that this "non-identity problem" is solved by her theory because the latter depicts today's claimants not as familial but as "structural" descendants of slaves (62) -- persons who would themselves have been enslaved during the life of chattel slavery. I'll later explain why this seems to me an illusory problem.

Nuti also perceives defects in received theories that are sympathetic to reparations claims. She observes, for example, that current theories fail to determine which of the many historical injustices should receive priority of attention. Nuti reduces the scope of this problem by focusing her theory not on all past wrongs but only those that are "reproduced" after a society has undertaken effective reforms. Examples to which these conditions apply would include, in addition to the case of women, the establishment of Jim Crow following the abolition of slavery despite significant reforms of the post-Civil War Reconstruction, and today's continued racial stratification despite reforms of the "Second Reconstruction." Limiting the scope of her theory in this way is quite reasonable because the persistence of injustice calls for reparative action. But it does not clearly solve the original problem, for Nuti's theory does not tell us which of the relevant historical injustices are most urgent to address. Should we focus first, for example, on Native Americans or African Americans? Or is that the wrong way to approach the issue? Perhaps such priority must be determined by a combination of moral judgment, political prudence, and circumstantial opportunity.

Current theories that recognize significant connections between past and present injustices -- theories that come closest to Nuti's own view -- are also faulted. Nuti claims that, "as they stand, accounts focusing on the necessity of repairing the unjust past because of its effects on present inequalities do not offer an interpretation of the relation between past and present injustices that is sufficiently compelling" to rebut the claim that "there is no need to look to the past to challenge present injustices." "What is needed," she says, "is a more complex and dynamic understanding of history and of its presence." (19)

I demur. In labeling the problem she attributes to these theories as that of "redundancy," (17) Nuti implies that "forward-looking" considerations of distributive justice might fully duplicate those of reparative justice. But that seems to ignore an essential component of reparative justice -- the acknowledgment of past wrongs. I will also argue that Nuti's theory itself fails to offer a "compelling" account of connections between past and present injustices because it offers no guidance for identifying such connections and relies entirely on independent investigations into them, the results of which it merely labels as "structures," whatever they might turn out to be.

We can see this by considering the basic components of the theory. Nuti says that we must "de-temporalize injustice," which "means showing that unjust history is present in a deep and dynamic way." This "entails reconceptualizing history (and unjust historical events) as long-term structures." (13) "We can then see how historical injustices are not past but newly reproduced into the present." (14) None of these metaphors are adequately explained.

The core of Nuti's theory may be summarized, more transparently, as follows: when historical injustices are manifestations of underlying conditions that have not been eliminated by genuine social reforms, those conditions become newly manifested in somewhat different forms. This seems to me correct,2 as far as it goes.

For present purposes, it is not necessary to go much further into Nuti's elaboration of the "structural" interpretation of historical injustice, except to emphasize the following point. Nuti says that she "cannot offer a full-fledged account of historical structures, nor can I develop a blueprint for how historical long-term structures should be identified." We do not require blueprints; we ask, rather, for criteria of application for the term "historical structure." These are not forthcoming.

Nuti says instead that the task of identifying "structural" connections between past and present injustice is "contextual," best done "by activist groups fighting for justice who have been constructing narratives that identify and specify unjust historical structures." (32) I agree that those who struggle against injustice promote our understanding of its underlying conditions as well as of corrective measures. But in fact much of what we know about the connections between past and present injustice -- such as the connections between Jim Crow and current racial inequities -- results from rigorous scholarship by economists, sociologists, historians, and others.3 Nuti's theory is incapable of providing any guidance for their research. Has the relevant research been conducted by political activists? We can say this: as values guide the choice of research topics and hypotheses, no doubt much of that research reflects moral commitments by engaged scholars, some of whom may themselves have been, or may be, activists, at least as public intellectuals.

Nuti appears to criticize current theorizing that links existing inequities to past injustices as depicting a relatively simple causal connection between past and present. I disagree. Let's consider some history.4

Following World War Two, during the "Cold War" between the United States and the Soviet Union, the federal government, facing an emerging civil rights movement at home and a colonial liberation movement abroad, formally renounced white supremacy and adopted significant reforms, such as the enforcement of voting rights. That Second Reconstruction was limited like the first in depth and duration and was soon followed by a white supremacist backlash. The 1960s' "War on Poverty" soon gave way to a "War on Crime," which disproportionately targeted African Americans, especially for non-violent transgressions that have been no more common in the black than in the white community, and this has led to their mass incarceration. Racial bias underlies attacks on the federal "safety net." Significantly achieved voting rights are currently under attack. Civil rights reforms have had modest effect on the resistance by whites to desegregation of neighborhoods and schools. And public policies have never challenged the entrenched material inequities that make a black infant's life prospects decidedly inferior to the life prospects of her white peers, which encompass, among other things, inferior housing, inferior schools, poorer health, inferior job opportunities, greater unemployment, a substantially lower standard of living, less chance of owning a home, less chance of enabling her children to fare better, a shorter life and, in fact, less chance of surviving infancy. The conditions that such a comparison represents, combined with the toll of stress that results from African Americans' sound sense of vulnerability (e.g., to unwarranted lethal attacks by police) and sound perception of social disparagement, reflect what Nuti would label "historical structures."

The explanation of these persisting injustices is multi-faceted and complex, involving decisions by individuals and by institutions, ranging from private clubs to government entities, as well as "structural racism" -- institutional arrangements that perpetuate racial stratification without requiring deliberate or intentional discrimination. This is no simple causal account.

Such a recounting supports Nuti's point that persisting injustices stem from underlying conditions that survive significant reforms. But her theory does not tell us what to look for in seeking to identify and understand the connections between past and present. That must be determined by independently guided investigations. The theory simply tells us to label them as "structures."

We can now return to the non-identity problem. It assumes that reparations would involve cash payments to descendants of slaves, it argues that they would not have existed but for their ancestors' enslavement, and it maintains (somewhat problematically) that the benefit of having been given life outweighs any relevant disadvantages. But a plausible reparations argument identifies potential beneficiaries of morally warranted reparations not as descendants of persons wronged but simply as persons whose current disadvantages can reasonably be traced to past and current wrongdoing.

Consider for example lead poisoning, whose extremely serious effects upon physical and mental development were sufficiently appreciated more than forty years ago to result in a federal ban on lead household paint in 1978. Many older houses and apartments that are rented to low-income families retain lead-painted surfaces that produce lead-contaminated dust, which is a principal source of lead poisoning. Children are most at risk and African American children are at greater risk than white children because of their families' lower incomes, which is exacerbated by housing conditions in black neighborhoods that have been adversely affected by such factors as "redlining," which increases the cost of, or makes unavailable, home improvement loans. These conditions flow directly and indirectly from systematic discrimination. And it is demonstrably clear that the greater exposure of black children to lead poisoning constitutes but one strand of a vast web of disadvantages that stems from America's long-standing commitment to the theory and practice of white supremacy, which has survived the abolition of slavery as well as the dismantling of Jim Crow.

Any serious attempt to eliminate African American children's greater risk of lead poisoning would require ensuring black families' access to good housing, which would in turn require livable wages for their parents and affordable good housing. I leave it to the reader to begin to imagine what reforms would bring those changes about.

In the case of deficits such as greater exposure to poisons like lead as well as blacks' higher rates of infant and maternal mortality, "crash programs" are called for. Repairing wrongs that involve harm requires in the first place repairing the harm and doing so as urgently as their seriousness demands. This is one reason why a morally adequate reparations program would not simply involve cash payments (though it would no doubt involve cash as well, for reasons that go beyond the scope of this review).

It seems clear that little could be accomplished without a firm national commitment to an entire set of programs that are designed to end racial stratification. It may be noted in passing, however, that administratively and economically feasible versions of many specific programs, such as a program to radically minimize lead poisoning and to treat any such occurrence, would benefit many white as well as black children (and other children of color). This fact might increase their political feasibility. That fact, I believe, would not disqualify such programs from being material components of a morally adequate reparations program.

In sum, this book provides much detailed, useful discussion of long-lasting, systematic injustice, including most notably systematic injustice to women, as well as of reasonable corrective policies. All that is supplemented by a theoretical apparatus that sheds little light, however, on the relevant social phenomena.

1 Including me; see, e.g., my “Reparations for Slavery and Jim Crow, Its Assumptions and Implications,” in Oxford Handbook of Philosophy and Race, ed. N. Zack (New York: Oxford University Press, 2017), pp. 505-515.

2 With minor qualifications, as Nuti in effect acknowledges: some past injustices, such as violence against women, simply continue into the present.

3 See, e.g., the bibliography of my book, The Color Line: A Short Introduction (New York: Routledge, 2020).

4 For a fuller account, see The Color Line, chaps. 17-18, 21-22.