Inner Speech: New Voices

Placeholder book cover

Peter Langland-Hassan and Agustín Vicente (eds.), Inner Speech: New Voices, Oxford University Press, 2018, 336pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198796640.

Reviewed by Marta Jorba, University of the Basque Country (UPV/EHU)


This collection offers a comprehensive, diverse and timely treatment of inner speech, the phenomenon of "the little voice in the head". It is the first volume entirely dedicated to inner speech from an interdisciplinary perspective and includes contributions by leading experts in philosophy, psychology and neuroscience. Inner speech is a pervasive feature of our minds that is introspectively salient and empirically tractable, a feature whose nature and functions are a matter of debate. It is a language-like phenomenon that has been seen as a form of thought or intrinsically related to it, a conscious phenomenon that involves a perceptual hearing component, and is also involved in several cognitive functions. The book offers an in-depth treatment of the phenomenon from both theoretical and empirical approaches and thus provides a unique platform to contrast and evaluate the various approaches. Moreover, by directly engaging with inner speech, its contributors provide insights into the nature of thinking, consciousness, perception, action, self-knowledge and the self, thus presenting a network of interrelated topics for the study of the mind.

The book is divided into two parts; the first six chapters are devoted to the nature of inner speech and the second six to the self-reflection and self-knowledge functions attributed to inner speech. The chapters can be read quite independently. However, it should be noted that the interdisciplinary value of the book might become an obstacle for readers not familiar with technical terms and methods in philosophy, psychology or neuroscience.

The editors, Peter Langland-Hassan and Agustín Vicente, provide an instructive introduction, presenting the complexity of the phenomenon, the motivation for focusing on it, its intrinsic interest as well as its connection to a wide range of other perennial questions in philosophy and psychology. They offer a general and very useful map to navigate the landscape. They first provide a broad-brush description of the history of the study of inner speech, mainly highlighting the still influential work of the Russian psychologist Lev S. Vygotsky (1987) together with experimental psychology research on working memory (Baddeley 1992, 2007). In analytic philosophy of mind, the topic was of peripheral interest until the nineties, when several thinkers started to focus on inner speech for their theories of consciousness, explanations of auditory verbal hallucinations (AVHs) and inserted thoughts, self-knowledge, or the relation of language and thought. In the rest of the introduction, Langland-Hassan and Vicente summarize the book's main contributions, making use of several guiding questions.

The book's central questions are, first, what is the nature of inner speech and, second, what is/are the function(s) of inner speech in cognitive processes. All the contributors present their  views on one or both questions, as well as discussing other more specific related issues.

Regarding the nature of inner speech: while the "little voice in the head" is a pre-theoretically good enough expression to localize the phenomenon, more technical definitions reveal the discrepancies as to what should count as proper inner speech. It is difficult to find a unified way of referring to the phenomenon in the book, as different definitions are found depending on the focus of inquiry and the level of description or explanation: (i) the experience of inner speech, (ii) the causes and mechanisms that underlie inner speech and (iii) the neurological evidence associated with inner speech-involving tasks. Examples of all these perspectives can be found in the volume. The book leaves quite open the specific ways in which such characterizations are (in)compatible or rather complement each other.

Russell T. Hurlburt and Christopher L. Heavey (Chapter 6) are the main proponents of a detailed description of (i), the experience of inner speech. They focus on what they call the "pristine experience of inner speech", meaning the phenomenon that occurs and is directly apprehended by people in their everyday environment. Using the Descriptive Sampling Method (DES), designed to explore pristine inner experience in high fidelity (p. 179) -- described and discussed in several other works (Hurlburt and Akther 2006; Hurlburt and Schwitzgebel 2007) -- they present different varieties of inner experience: unworded speech, inner speech with complete sentences, and unsymbolized thinking. Hurlburt and Heavey are reluctant to base definitions (and subsequent theories) of inner speech on casual introspection, questionnaires and sampling that does not provide training in bracketing presuppositions or inferences from experimental settings.

As examples of (ii), the causes and mechanisms that underlie inner speech, we find the complex discussion on computational models of inner speech, in particular motor control models. Seven contributions mention or discuss the issue whether inner speech can be regarded as the product of a forward model. A forward model is an internal representation of the system (body, limb, organ) that captures the forward or causal relationship between the inputs to the system (motor commands) and the outputs (Lœvenbruck et al., p. 147). The details of the various existing proposals are presented by Lauren Swiney and by Hèléne Lœvenbruck et al. Swiney (Chapter 12) presents the conceptions of inner speech implied in the different accounts of schizophrenia symptoms such as AVHs and inserted thoughts. She describes in detail two competing models: (i) inner speech as a prediction in the absence of sensory input (which parallels the literature in motor imagery), or (ii) inner speech as an act with sensory consequences that are themselves predicted (which parallels the literature on language production). Swiney's chapter could have appeared in Part I next to the one on computational models by Lœvenbruck et al., which would have also maintained the homogeneity of Part II's contents (self-knowledge and self-reflection functions of inner speech).

A development of (i) is given by Lœvenbruck et al. (Chapter 5) with their clear exposition of the various notions and processes involved in the predictive control model (forward model, efference copy, sensory attenuation, etc.). Lœvenbruck et al. also defend the idea -- in contrast to the other approaches -- of talking about inner language, conceived of as multimodal acts with multisensory percepts (auditory, somatosensory, visual), stemming from coarse multisensory goals. Accepting definitions that rely on the causes and mechanism underlying inner speech, Peter Carruthers argues that inner speech is an attended sensory forward model of a rehearsed speech action, where the action has been selected over the others by unconscious appraisal and decision-making processes.

Focusing on (iii), the neurological evidence associated with inner speech-involving tasks, Sharon Geva (Chapter 4) offers a detailed and exhaustive review of the main findings of the neural basis of mental imagery and inner speech. The bulk of her chapter is dedicated to functional imaging studies, summarizing the main results related to a variety of inner speech-involving tasks (pp. 108-117): word repetition, verb generation, stem completion, rhyme judgment, homophone judgment, fluency, and verbal transformation. After reviewing the studies of inner speech in aphasia (pp. 117-119), she discusses the principles of mental imagery through its common mechanisms: auditory, visual, and olfactory imagery activate primary sensory areas, whereas inner speech and motor imagery are higher brain functions that require multiple steps and processors. In the case of inner speech, linguistic processing, perception and execution are involved.

One interesting question regarding the nature of inner speech treated by several contributors is whether inner speech presents an auditory-phonological nature and whether this is an essential property or an associated episode. Langland-Hassan (Chapter 3) answers affirmatively, claiming that inner speech has an auditory-phonological component (or represents it). His argument summarized is that: (1) inner speech is keyed to a specific natural language, (2) the only feature that inner speech episodes plausibly have that will allow us to swiftly and reliably determine which language they are keyed to is their auditory-phonological component (semantics, syntax, phonology, graphology and articulation are discarded), and (3) therefore, inner speech must have an auditory-phonological component. From this introspective argument, he moves to the essential claim that all inner speech involves an auditory-phonological component by arguing that unconscious inner speech has it as well. Langland-Hassan's article is a good example of an empirically-informed philosophical argument on the topic.

Sam Wilkinson and Charles Fernyhough (Chapter 9) take a different position regarding the auditory-phonological nature of inner speech. They claim that inner speech represents both the sound of an utterance and a state of affairs with semantic content, although just the latter is assessable for accuracy. The auditory-phonological representations are cases of "content without commitment" (p. 256). They further argue that we can be misled about two specific aspects of the representation, the kind of mental state one is in when engaging in inner speech and the agent of the episode, whose speech act it is (thus leading to episodes of AVHs). Even if inner speech episodes represent sounds, Wilkinson and Fernyhough maintain that inner speaking and inner hearing are two distinct but related phenomena. For them, inner speech is a productive rather than a re-creative phenomenon of imagining or inner hearing -- even if inner hearing and inner speaking are related. Hurlburt and Heavey also defend a sharp distinction between these two phenomena.

Christopher Gauker (Chapter 2), in contrast, states that inner speech is a kind of thought that consists in internal tokening of words and sentences of a natural language and, crucially, the auditory-phonological component is not a proper part of inner speech but rather an associated episode by which we become aware of inner speech. This view characterizes inner speech in analogy with outer speech, where we can distinguish between outer speech per se and the perception or comprehension of outer speech. Inner speech per se would be the result of production mechanisms and the perception of inner speech would be a related but separated phenomenon. Interestingly for the discussion on the auditory-phonological component, Geva also concludes her contribution by stating that the activation of brain auditory areas and the presence of auditory percepts of inner speech is still a matter of debate.

One way to know about the nature of inner speech is by exploring its pathologies and the cases in which one or several features of the processes functions differently. The most examined cases are the conditions of AVHs and the delusion of thought insertion. Swiney explains that failures of inner speech that have to do with AVHs and inserted thoughts have been posited to affect the sense of agency, resulting in inner speech that is not felt as one's own. This model, she argues, still presents open questions about the way in which the approach specifies inner speech in relation to overt actions such as hand movement or talking. She then discusses the different views on the mechanisms that might underpin both symptoms. Langland-Hassan proposes a new way of conceiving them in which a unified diagnostic might be available. Inserted thoughts would be a subset of AVHs insofar as reports of inserted thoughts seem to the patient to occur in natural language and, thus, following Langland-Hassan's argument, can be said to possess auditory-phonological properties.

Moving to the second issue, the function/s of inner speech, we again find several views. On the one hand, Carruthers (Chapter 1) suggests that inner speech functions enable the mental rehearsal and evaluation of overt speech actions. The proper function of inner speech is, according to him, conscious planning, although it has evolved to play other roles. For Wilkinson and Fernyhough, we talk to ourselves as a way of expressing and reflecting on our own minds without having to risk giving that information away. Relying on this reflection function, Alain Morin (Chapter 11) reviews a comprehensive body of empirical work to show the self-reflective role of inner speech, understood as involving different forms of what he (perhaps too) broadly calls 'self-awareness': self-ascription, self-concept formation, self-knowledge, self-evaluation, self-esteem, sense of agency, self-regulation, mental time travel, and self-efficiency. He argues that the kind of information about the self that inner speech can provide is mostly conceptual, and so inner speech is not necessary to achieve lower, more perceptual forms of self-referential activities.

Picking out a specific reflection function, Edouard Machery (Chapter 10) argues that inner speech allows us to transparently know our beliefs, in contrast to our desires, which are opaque: beliefs are transparently communicated by assertions (although not all), while desires are not. The listener does not need anything more than the speech act to be justified in believing that the speaker believes so and so (this is why they are transparent). According to him, inner speech is a form of communication and beliefs are social mental states: they exist to be communicated.

Still within the question of the function of inner speech, José Luis Bermúdez (Chapter 7) defends the view that inner speech is required for intentional ascent, i.e., thinking about our thinking. The idea is that we can only think our thoughts when they are linguistically formulated. The two cases presented by Bermúdez are reflective evaluation and monitoring of one's own thinking and propositional attitude mindreading. He presents a nine-step argument (p. 202) to defend his view. He then responds to two main objections to the view: the problem that inner speech is too semantically indeterminate to present a thought as the object of reflective awareness (Martínez-Manrique and Vicente 2010) and the problematic implication that the view has of carrying two different types of content (auditory and propositional) at the same time (Langland-Hassan 2014). Regarding the first, Bermúdez provides an alternative way of thinking about semantic indeterminacy and linguistic understanding (pp. 207-211) and, with respect to the second, he argues that the problem with the two represented contents disappears when one denies that inner speech, besides having auditory-phonological properties, also represents those properties (pp. 213-217).

Bermúdez, together with other authors such as Clark (1998) and Prinz (2007) have been representatives of what have been called 'format views', according to which the proper function of inner speech is to enable thinking, and other functions are derivative of it. In contrast, activity views (Fernyhough 2009, Martínez-Manrique and Vicente 2015) of a Vygotskyan inspiration defend the position that inner speech is the activity of outer speech internalized, thus inheriting the main functions of speech acts: motivation, reminding, aid reasoning, etc. Relevant to this is the view Keith Frankish (Chapter 8) presents according to which, with certain modifications, the format and the activity view are compatible. He holds that one of the functions of inner speech is to provide a format (a representational medium) for conscious thinking, but is typically an activity, which has many functions continuous with those of outer speech. Frankish pairs inner speech with Type-2 thinking -- a slow, serial, conscious form of reasoning linked to language, conceived as a form of intentional action -- in contrast with Type-1 thinking -- fast, non-conscious and automatic. He defends the claim that intentional reasoning is a cyclical process in which inner speech is used in particular steps. This process is an internalization of linguistic exchanges in problem-solving settings.

The recurring and common topics that provide a diversity of approaches to a single issue are one of the most interesting aspects of the book, as we have already seen. Perhaps inevitably, however, some questions are treated only in one chapter or are just briefly mentioned in others. A central issue to inner speech research that could have been included in a separate chapter concerns methodological questions on empirical investigations. Aside from Hurlburt and Heavey's brief discussion on methods, we do not find anything on the usefulness and reliability of questionnaires or sampling methods, on their possibilities and limitations, or on suggestions about how to integrate (if possible) phenomenological reports with indirect measures. Phenomenological reports track subjective qualities of inner speech while indirect measures, relying mainly on articulatory suppression or phonological judgments, purport to show the presence or absence of inner speech in the realization of cognitive tasks. A general methodological discussion could have enriched this already very complete treatment of inner speech.

Another missing element is the treatment and development of the role of inner speech in pathologies other than schizophrenia. Beyond the specific differential functioning of inner speech in AVHs and inserted thoughts, the volume only incorporates brief discussions of the role of inner speech in aphasia (mainly in Geva's chapter, pp. 117-119), but doesn't cover research on the role of inner speech in other linguistic impairments or in other conditions such as autistic spectrum conditions (ASC). Although research on inner speech and autism is not abundant, there are a few studies that have dealt with this issue (see Williams et al. 2016) and could have contributed to expand horizons on inner speech and psychopathologies.

Overall, the volume succeeds in its attempt to provide common general research questions beyond the more or less isolated contributions on the topic that could be found in the literature so far. But as a first comprehensive compilation of approaches to inner speech, it is understandable that "the work of extracting the key points of agreement and dispute among different research programs remains to be done" (p. 4), as the editors point out. In my opinion, this very same fact makes the book an interesting and useful platform for further discussion and development of the topic. All in all, the book is an excellent collection of cutting-edge research on the philosophy, psychology and neuroscience of inner speech, a phenomenon that is key to many different cognitive processes. Carefully engaging with it will prove useful to students, professors, researchers and anyone interested in the nature of the mind.


Baddeley, A. D. (1992). "Working memory", Science, 255(5044), 556-9.

Baddeley, A. D. (2007). Working memory, thought and action. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Clark, A. (1998). "Magic words: how language augments human computation". In P. Carruthers and J. Boucher (eds.), Language and Thought: Interdisciplinary Themes (pp. 162-83). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Fernyhough, C. (2009). "Dialogic thinking". In A. Winsler, C. Fernyhough, and I. Montero (eds.), Private Speech, Executive Functioning, and the Development of Verbal Self-Regulation, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 42-52.

Hurlburt, R. T., and Akhter, S. A. (2006). "The Descriptive Experience Sampling method", Phenomenology and the Cognitive Sciences, 5, 271-301.

Hurlburt, R. T., and Schwitzgebel, E. (2007). Describing inner experience? Proponent meets skeptic. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Langland-Hassan, P. (2014). "Inner speech and metacognition: In search of a connection", Mind and Language, 29, 511-33.

Martínez-Manrique, F., and Vicente, A. (2010). "What the . . . ! The role of inner speech in conscious thought", Journal of Consciousness Studies, 17, 141-67.

Martínez-Manrique, F., and Vicente, A. (2015). "The activity view of inner speech", Frontiers in Psychology, 6(232), 1-13.

Prinz, J. J. (2007). "All consciousness is perceptual". In B. P. McLaughlin and J. D. Cohen (eds.), Contemporary Debates in Philosophy of Mind, Oxford, UK: Blackwell Publishing, 335-57.

Vygotsky, L. S. (1987). Thinking and speech. In The collected works of L. S. Vygotsky (Vol. 1). New York: Plenum (Original work published 1934).

Williams, D.M., Peng, C., Wallace, G. L, (2016). "Verbal Thinking and Inner Speech in Autism Spectrum Disorder", Neuropsychol Rev 26:394-419.