Inside Ethics: On the Demands of Moral Thought

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Alice Crary, Inside Ethics: On the Demands of Moral Thought, Harvard University Press, 2016, 283pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674967816.

Reviewed by Andrea C. Westlund, University of Wisconsin-Milwaukee


Alice Crary presents a deep challenge to certain widely shared assumptions about the nature and limits of ethical thought, along with a compelling invitation to think differently about the moral status and qualities of humans and animals. Most contemporary ethicists assume that any objective representation of human and animal life must be developed outside of ethics, using the normatively neutral methods of, for example, the natural sciences. Crary, in contrast, argues that humans and animals have empirically observable moral characteristics, recognition of which is crucial to moral thought, but which are inaccessible to us when we limit ourselves to neutral methods. Good, "world-guided" moral thought, according to Crary, requires the use of capacities such as moral imagination, the exercise of which is elicited by methods (including various narrative techniques) that are characteristic of the arts and humanities. Works employing such methods contribute directly to moral understanding by drawing us into the imaginative exploration of other moral perspectives (10).

The first part of the book is devoted to careful argumentation against the idea that we must accept an "ethically indifferent metaphysic" (2) and in favor of a certain kind of ethical realism. After defending her view against pertinent objections and differentiating it from other, apparently similar views that have been advanced in recent years, Crary spends the remaining chapters exploring literary works (both fiction and non-fiction) that she takes to support the view that humans and animals are all inside ethics, simply in virtue of being humans or animals of some kind. She also argues that works of literature are not merely a source of rich examples for ethical thinking, but also inform our understanding of human and animal lives in distinctively literary ways. As such, Crary's book will be of value not only to ethicists of all sorts (meta-, normative, and practical) and to those with particular interests in disability studies or animal ethics, but also to those with philosophical interests in literature and narrative theory.

In Chapter 1, Crary embarks on a radical re-visioning of objective reality as including, rather than excluding, moral values. The idea that reality includes objective moral values combines objectivism (the idea that moral judgments are essentially concerned with how things are) with internalism (the idea that moral judgments have direct bearing on our reasons for acting). The dominant stance in philosophical ethics, she points out, is to embrace a hard metaphysic that rejects one or both of these ideas. Crary identifies, as the unquestioned starting point for such a metaphysic, the "familiar and allegedly scientific worldview" (31) according to which the natural sciences have exclusive authority to tell us what reality is objectively like. A central part of Chapter 1 is devoted to showing how both Peter Singer and Christine Korsgaard accept this starting point and embrace, in different ways, the hard metaphysic to which it leads.

To make room for an alternative starting point, Crary distinguishes between two different notions of objectivity -- narrow and wide -- a distinction that depends in turn on the distinction between qualities that are merely subjective and those that are subjective but not merely so. A merely subjective quality is one that can be ascribed to an object just insofar as that object actually elicits a certain subjective response from someone. A quality that is subjective but not merely subjective is one that can be ascribed to an object just insofar as that object would elicit a certain kind of response under appropriate conditions. The hard metaphysic that she rejects assumes a narrow conception of objectivity, which expels from objective reality not just qualities that are merely subjective but also those that are subjective in the second sense. Crary embraces a wide notion of objectivity, which excludes qualities that are merely subjective but includes, as a part of objective reality, some qualities that are essentially related to subjectivity and which, moreover, are of ethical significance. Crucial amongst these qualities are the mental characteristics of humans and animals.

Chapter 2 contains Crary's main argument in defense of the idea that humans and animals are inside ethics (that is, that they have empirically observable moral qualities). Her argumentative strategy borrows from Wittgenstein's writings on mindedness, specifically his arguments concerning rule-following, privacy, and change of aspect. Crary draws on these arguments to reject the idea that the world is available to thought in an unmediated way, and to suggest, with Wittgenstein, that our practice-bound subjective responses "contribute internally to our ability to grasp features of the world." (55) Instead of pointing toward some form of skepticism about objectivity, however, she takes this point about thought to support a move to her wider notion of objectivity.

Drawing further on Wittgenstein, Crary argues that psychological qualities are inseparably linked to expressive behavior, and that grasping the expressive behavior of a human or animal depends upon an understanding of what's important in the life of creatures of that kind. Since the notion of importance in a life is an ethically inflected one, the psychological categories we use in representing the expressive behavior of humans and animals turn out to be ethically loaded ones -- a result that she describes as a form of "ethical externalism" about the mind (80). In the context of Crary's defense of a wider conception of objectivity, this ethical externalism lends itself to a form of "commonsense realism" about the mind: the idea that our ethically inflected psychological categories resist reduction to any more fundamental (physical or material) terms, and may figure in "objectively faithful" (82) representations of the lives in question.

Crary argues that this commonsense realism has transformative implications for how we think about ethics: it vindicates the apparently internalist and objectivist character of moral judgement, and also shows that moral thought extends beyond moral judgement into our representations of the minded lives of humans and animals. Moreover, it illuminates the important role played by moral imagination in delivering to us a conception of what's important to creatures enmeshed in certain kind of lives.

Because Crary's common-sense realism about the mind hinges, in part, on a defense of conceptualism about perceptual experience, one might worry that animals are in danger of being left outside of ethics after all -- for one might think that on a conceptualist view, non-rational animals lack the capacity for anything other than very primitive qualities of mind, and thus lead ethically bereft lives in which only a few extremely basic things are important. She argues convincingly, in Chapter 3, that this unwelcome result does not follow from conceptualism. Crary points out that conceptualism does not require a notion of concepts that excludes non-rational animals from possessing them. She herself favors a more flexible, developmentally-sensitive notion of concepts, one that allows us to bring more creatures -- including pre-rational children, as well as many animals -- into the conceptualist fold. The chapter ends with a rich discussion of the lives of dogs (drawn in part from memoirs), which reveals just how strained and limiting it would be to treat dogs as "mere bundles of stimulus response mechanisms" rather than as beings who "occupy partial stages of rational development" (120) and lead lives in which certain things matter.

In Chapter 4, Crary argues that the foregoing arguments support the conclusion that all humans and animals are proper objects of moral concern -- that is, that the sheer fact of being human, or of being an animal of some kind, is morally significant. Moral standing is grounded not in the possession of specific capacities that could be identified and described in morally neutral terms (and which might or might not be possessed by individual members of a species), but rather, in membership in the relevant kind. Morally appropriate responsiveness to members of a kind (human, dog, etc.) depends on what is important in the lives of capacity-typical beings of that kind, whether or not a particular individual has the typical capacities.

Here Crary explores works of fiction and non-fiction, including, among others, the novel Flowers for Algernon by Daniel Keyes and John Bayley's memoir about Iris Murdoch's journey into Alzheimer's. Both works beautifully illustrate the idea that the special vulnerabilities associated with developmental delays, disease, and death do not diminish moral standing but in fact call for special forms of care and concern. Borrowing a term from Hilde Lindemann, Crary speaks of the call to "hold" others in their identity even in the face of their alienation from much or all that is important in human life. A similarly sensitive discussion of J.M. Coetzee's novel Disgrace extends the point to the norms governing our treatment of dogs (and, by extension, other animals) both in life and in death. In these passages we get our first sense of how the methodological implications of Crary's earlier argument play out in practice: instead of being presented solely with arguments of a traditional, narrowly conceived form, we are invited to enter into the narratively constructed world of specific humans and dogs and to exercise our moral imaginations in ways that allow us to observe and appreciate the moral qualities of the beings in question.

Crary continues, in later chapters, to draw on literary examples to extend and reinforce her argument. Chapter 6 focuses on novels by Leo Tolstoy, Coetzee, and W.G. Sebald, all of which she takes to reveal a certain kind of fellowship between humans and animals: each invites recognition of the preciousness and pathos of their transient lives, as "mortals with one shot at flourishing" (223), and of their shared vulnerability to harms of various sorts (disease, displacement, captivity, mistreatment, and so on). We are led to view the humans and animals central to these novels as individuals with their own histories and perspectives, all heart-breakingly vulnerable to the loss or destruction of what matters to them.

Instead of extending the argument further, Chapter 7 is focused on highlighting the practical significance of narrative techniques that cast animals in a morally rich light. Crary examines their persuasive use in non-fiction works that criticize the treatment of animals in factory farming and in scientific experimentation. In coming to regard animals as individuals and as subjects of lives within which things like physical freedom, health, play, and sociality matter, she argues, we come to appreciate the horror of their treatment in modern factory farms and laboratory settings in a way that we would not, simply by considering an ethically neutral description of the animals' characteristics and capacities.

These final two chapters, along with parts of Chapter 4, advance the interesting claim that literature as literature contributes directly to moral philosophy. On Crary's view, works of literature are not just rich sources of examples (a use to which many moral philosophers are happy to put them), but do philosophical work by bringing humans and animals "empirically into view" (203) in a way that neutral, scientific methods cannot. The main literary device to which Crary appeals is the alternation between different perspectives -- and especially the strategic use of first-person perspective -- to draw us into certain ways of seeing and responding to the world. A recurring theme is the way in which imaginatively exploring another perspective may lead to the development of new, otherwise inaccessible sensitivities and emotional responses. In Coetzee's novel Disgrace, for example, we are drawn into Lurie's perspective and invited to "identify with individual animals in their physical vulnerability and need for comfort" (231) and to "look at dogs' corpses . . . so that they appear to demand certain forms of respect and attention." (156) In Tolstoy's Strider, we are invited into the perspective of the aging horse, Strider, himself. Crary suggests that, although clearly anthropomorphic, this use of first person perspective is an effective literary strategy for bringing the life of a horse into view and highlighting the nature of the wrongs done to that horse by human decisions and actions.

Crary's point about the use of perspective to encourage imaginative engagement is in one way uncontroversial: it is clearly the case that narrative presentation more readily engages attention and arouses empathy than a neutrally presented account of equine or canine or human capacities and vulnerabilities. Her further, and more controversial claim, is that such engagement puts us in touch with objectively real moral qualities of the creatures in question, the presence of which in turn justifies the affective responses evoked by the narrative. Crary acknowledges that this further claim requires defense, and steps back at various points to ask whether narrative techniques mightn't actually distort or fabricate aspects of reality rather than revealing them in a faithful, world-guided manner. She replies that we are justified in granting the perspectives in question cognitive authority because it turns out that they allow us to make sense of certain practices, both within the narrative and in real life, that we otherwise could not explain. Lurie's perspective, to revisit that example, invites us to regard dogs' corpses as calling for respectful treatment -- and Crary suggests that we are entitled to treat this perspective as authoritative insofar as doing so allows us to make sense of certain practices for handling the bodies of deceased animals and related practices for handling the bodies of deceased humans. The perspective allows us, as it were, to understand the practices from the inside, as a participant understands them.

While I'm receptive to Crary's claims on behalf of the philosophical and ethical significance of works of art and literature, it is not clear how satisfactory her argument on this point will be to less antecedently sympathetic readers. Although literature is well-known to elicit empathy, it is an equally familiar point that we are highly susceptible to being misled by a good story. Narrative is capable of manipulating our emotions and enlisting them in service of nefarious ends as well as admirable ones. We might wonder how to adjudicate between narrative perspectives that provide very different, but equally coherent, sense-making accounts of social practices, and which cast them in radically different ethical lights. In the extreme, practices that appear evil from one perspective might appear morally required from another. When each of two or more competing narrative perspectives engages us emotionally and makes sense of its favored practices from the inside, we would seem to be in need of some further way of assessing their authority over our responses. A fuller defense of narrative's contribution to moral understanding would have to explain why we needn't revert, in our further assessments, to alternative, non-narrative forms of justification.

This challenge by no means undermines Crary's main thesis, that humans and animals have empirically observable moral qualities, a claim for which she argues without recourse to literary devices in the earlier part of the book. Nor should it dissuade anyone one from giving serious consideration to Crary's methodological arguments, which are original and interesting and certainly worthy of further exploration. It may be fruitful, for example, to consider how other narrative techniques, beyond those considered here, might contribute to moral understanding, and also to consider the significance of differences in genre between the sorts of narratives on which Crary draws. Finally, there are surely productive connections to be drawn between her arguments about emotional sensitivity and moral understanding, and other recent work in philosophy of emotion.

Crary's book has much to recommend it. It provokes us to think differently about animals and humans by challenging some of philosophers' most widespread assumptions about objectivity, rationality, and argumentation. It contains careful and illuminating discussions of related work by Korsgaard, Singer, John McDowell, Michael Thompson, Philippa Foot, and Cary Wolfe, much of which I've been unable to discuss here. Crary's arguments are wide-ranging and creative, and her defense of moral imagination (along with the works of art and literature that engage it) constitutes a refreshingly unapologetic defense of the arts and humanities being valuable in their own terms. In a culture increasingly oriented toward the promotion of STEM fields, this is a contribution of consequence not just for literature and the arts but also, potentially, for philosophy itself.