Insiders and Outsiders in Seventeenth-Century Philosophy

Placeholder book cover

G.A.J. Rogers, Tom Sorrell and Jill Kraye (eds.), Insiders and Outsiders in Seventeenth-Century Philosophy, Routledge, 2010, 325pp., $118.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415806091.

Reviewed by Eric Schliesser, Ghent University



Imagine a possible distant future in which the poet-philosopher, Jody Azzouni, is at the core of the undergraduate curriculum. His views on ontology are routinely taught in order to prepare students for the great questions of the day. There are, of course, pesky historians who insist that the neo-scholastic reawakening inaugurated by David Lewis should be represented in the undergraduate curriculum - they claim persuasively that for about a century Lewis attracted far more attention than Azzouni. (In his contribution to the volume under review Robert Adams calls the focus on possible worlds and the logic of modality the “coming of age of American philosophy” (312).) In his day Lewis attracted the very best graduate students in the leading philosophy department; working out the detailed implications of the various components of his system seemed to dominate philosophy for over a century. Meanwhile, Azzouni, who was by no means unknown in his time, never attracted PhD students. His work seemed to prohibit the parceling out of projects so necessary in an age of shortened PhDs, instant publication, and the division of labor within progressive research programs. Ironically, in the twenty-first century Azzouni was better known as a quirky novelist and feminist poet before he was rediscovered as the thinker who radically transformed philosophy postQuine.

So much for fantasy; it was inspired by the volume under review. Its core insight — to place five now canonical thinkers of the seventeenth century alongside five significant but now largely untaught and unread thinkers — is worthy of serious reflection. The five “outsiders” (Gassendi, Digby, Gale, Cudworth, and Malebranche) receive an article each. The five “insiders” (Descartes, Hobbes, Spinoza, Locke, and Leibniz) all receive at least two articles. The volume teaches that it is very hard to say at a given time what philosopher/system will last and what the reasons are for such enduringness. Another thing taught by the volume as a whole is that philosophers can rewrite their history in various ways so that a thinker can become an insider or return to canonical status when s/he was once not. “Analytic” philosophers may need their historical “myths” (Cottingham introducing his views on Descartes, 165), but philosophy will not always be analytic and its future may require different myths or a different attitude toward history.

In fact, at least four of the articles in the volume do not take historical reputation as definitively settled. The articles on Gassendi (by Margaret Osler), Digby (John Henry), and Malebranche (Andrew Pyle) all advocate (in different ways) a return to prominence of their chosen subject within the profession. Of the three Osler and Henry are aimed at fellow scholars while Pyle’s brief for bringing Malebranche “in from the cold” (145) also seems aimed at the profession at large (for the related distinction between “specialists” and “mainstream philosophers” see Sorrell on Hobbes, 193, and his contrasts between “specialists” and “leading philosophers” in his article on Descartes, 161). Pyle thinks that Malebranche offers a very usable “Cartesian Dualism” (128). Surprisingly, one of the “insider” chapters, Catherine Wilson on the reception of Leibniz, is also advocacy; Wilson wishes to remove Leibniz from the clutches of his follower, Wolff, and the “Kantian image of Leibniz” (304) and replace it with one inspired by a Herderian reading of Leibniz:

the continuity between man and animal, the multiplicity of possible perspectives, the ubiquity of sensitivity and appetite, the intrinsic value of individual personality and distinct cultures and the hints of materialism and eudaemonism — co-existing with a strong sense of virtue and moral progress - comprised for [Herder] the ‘truths out of Leibniz’ (305).

To be sure: this volume is not about the rediscovery of figures largely unknown in their own lifetime (e.g., Van Gogh in the history of painting; or closer to home, Bolzano or Frege in philosophy) or the rediscovery of a philosopher often deemed un-philosophical (e.g., the status of Xenophon in the twentieth century, but interestingly not the eighteenth). For all the “outsiders” were institutionally quite eminent (often more so than the “insiders”) in their lifetime: Gassendi was professor of the Collège Royal; Cudworth Master of Christ Church and Regius Professor of Hebrew at Cambridge University; Digby was a co-founder of the Royal Society; Malebranche’s father was secretary to King Louis XIII and famous; even Gale had several appointments at Oxford before his ejection on religious grounds. Digby’s book on the Powder of Sympathy was a huge bestseller in its day. All of the outsiders became outsiders due to developments in philosophy in later ages (with exception, perhaps, of Gale, whose work was distinctly set against the philosophy of his own time).

In particular, the volume reveals that Gassendi (35), Malebranche (122-3), and Cudworth (114-15) were demoted for a variety of interlocking reasons during the French Enlightenment centering on D’Alembert’s and Diderot’s Éncyclopédie. By contrast, Locke had his finest moment in that period once he became assimilated into a Lockean-Newtonian synthesis that in France was seen as friendly to developing Enlightenment views (266), while it was seen as friendly to Christian religion in England (263).1 (Interestingly, Rogers notes that Newton initially had read Locke as a Hobbist (261).) Moreover, Daniel Garber’s paper on the reception of Leibniz reveals that the French Enlightenment reading of Leibniz as mathematical polymath (and not a systematic metaphysician) persisted well into the nineteenth century despite the ever increasing availability of new Leibnizian texts.

Strikingly, the influential, eighteenth-century French gate-keepers (Fontenelle, Voltaire, Diderot, D’Alembert, etc) are almost no longer read or taught in philosophy departments. So, their enduring after-effects are largely invisible to later philosophers. The volume implicitly gives an answer to how that came about. Several contributors note that a number of the insiders only became so as a consequence of Kant’s and German Idealism’s re-working of the tradition and the nature of philosophy (see Wiep van Bunge on the understanding of Spinoza as a “Continental Rationalist”, 223-4; Rogers on the partial demotion of Locke, 261; Wilson on the construction of Leibniz by Kant, 296-301). But after Kant only Rousseau (the Enlightenment’s in-house critic) fits in an interesting way into the new narrative.

In fact, the most important element of the Kantian story is tacitly assumed throughout the volume: Descartes, whose natural philosophy was completely discredited by the second half of eighteenth century, was rescued as an important philosopher by Kant! With one or two notable exceptions the whole volume is quite traditional in being centered on the philosophical aftermath of Descartes - three of the other authors discussed (Gassendi, Hobbes, and Digby) were also in the Mersenne Circle, and of the remainder only Gale cannot be understood as responding to Descartes’ program in some way. But this way of reading the seventeenth century makes most sense if one understands the nature of “philosophy” through post-Kantian eyes! So the volume can somehow leave out Bacon, whose Great Instauration provides the proud epigraph of the Critique of Pure Reason; Kant’s new understanding of philosophy demotes Bacon to the mere promoter of “physical science”. Moreover, the Kantian/Idealist narrative does not allow much space to the eclectics Grotius and Pufendorf — both hugely influential in their day.

Thus, while nobody can deny that Gassendi was important in preparing the way for many standard Empiricist doctrines, the choice of four other “outsiders” seems arbitrary and without compelling philosophic vision; if Malebranche deserves to be rehabilitated, why not his great critics, Arnauld or Bayle? As Malenbranche’s advocate Pyle notes, it was Bayle who “largely demolished” the “harmonious synthesis between faith and reason sought by Malebranche” (123). If Malebranche must be read in order to situate Hume, the argument for Bayle is stronger yet. Why no chapter on the very subtle Geulincx (beloved by Nietzsche and Beckett)? G.A.J. Rogers’ introduction notes but does not explain the absence of women in the volume. Last but not least, why no chapter on Newton? Newton is being re-discovered by a large number of American and French historians of philosophy, after all.

The effects of parochial, canonical gate-keeping are visible elsewhere in this volume in two ways. First, negatively, the British contributors battle Ryle’s views on the history of philosophy (Pyle on Malebranche, 128; Cottingham on Descartes, 164ff; Rogers on Locke, 258; Ayers on Locke, 274; even the French Faye writing about Descartes and Heidegger takes a pot-shot at Ryle, 181). The only non-critical comment about Ryle is when he used as an authority on the mannerisms of Wittgensteinians (Sorrell on Descartes, 158). Russell comes in for similar, but far more muted criticism (Pyle on Malebranche, 125; Ayers on Locke, 269-70) as well as praise (Adams on Leibniz, 309ff). Yet, outside a certain generation in the UK (and, perhaps, a dated narrative within philosophy of mind), Ryle’s pronouncements on the history of philosophy do not loom very large. In fairness to Ayers, his article attempts to answer the question

why so many twentieth century British philosophers seem to have settled for a view of the Essay Concerning Human Understanding in particular as the work of a second-rate, coarse, muddled intellect, lucky in having his ideas developed or criticised by subtler minds (269).

The obsession with first and second raters (also evident in Rogers’ introduction, 5) seems very … un-philosophical. Nevertheless, a large part of Ayers’ very interesting answer involves explaining how Locke fits into the contested landscape between and within idealists and realists of British philosophy in the first half of the twentieth century (273), which, in turn, became the subject of “revolutionary” rejection of “metaphysics” by the (no means methodologically unified) founders of analytic philosophy (275). The other part of Ayer’s answer is a focus on style: Locke’s style was once highly “successful” but is now far removed from reigning philosophic style (277).

Second, positively, Robert Merrihew Adams traces Leibniz’s high status in twentieth-century analytic philosophy. While making some shrewd observations on the functioning of the American academic job market (312) and also noting the increasing number of very important Leibnizian texts that have become available (309-10), Adams stresses that Leibniz’s popularity is grounded in that he “repays study … in the frequency with which he offers answers to philosophical questions we have reasons to address to him” (311). Adams never explores who “we” are, but tacitly admits these questions may shift with fashion from logic at the start of the twentieth century to questions about body at its end. In treating Locke, Ayers provides the necessary illumination. Within twentieth-century analytic philosophy historical figures came only to be understood in terms of “separable ‘topics’, ‘problems’ or tasks for analysis.” A “philosopher’s overall motivation, strategy or struggle for system” are uninteresting (275). Ayers connects his analysis with the methodological debate within early modern philosophy between rational reconstruction (mainstream analytic philosophy) and contextual history (the leading specialists), but this judgment seems to me parochial (specifically, British). Alan Nelson and Michael Della Rocca, Americans who are by no means contextualists in Ayers’ sense, are with their students among the keenest historians of early modern philosophy at exploring the systematic nature of the philosophers they study.

* * * * *

Two of the five chapters on outsiders provide useful, general introductions to the thought and significance of Malebranche and Gassendi. Unfortunately, the chapter on Cudworth by Benjamin Carter devotes most attention to Cudworth’s life and very little to examining his views. The chapters on Digby and Gale are more ambitious.

John Henry’s chapter on Sir Kenelm Digby also starts by unapologetically claiming that Digby’s “posthumous reputation as a natural philosopher ought to be much greater than it is.” For Digby published the first “fully worked-out system of mechanical philosophy” in English in the same year (1644) as Descartes’ Principia (43). What makes Digby especially interesting is that his “quasi-atomistic mechanical philosophy was thoroughly Aristotelian” (44). Moreover, Digby’s Aristotelianism is self-conscious because he is aiming to defend “Roman Catholic theology”, especially the immortality of the soul (45; here one would have wished more comparisons with Descartes). Digby traces his atomism to Aristotle’s Generation and Corruption, a move popular among some earlier scholastic Aristotelians (70, n. 35). That is to say, Digby is very hard to incorporate into the dominant narrative of Early Modern philosophy with its many anti-Aristotelian commitments (see also Sorrell on Hobbes, 195). But Henry has no doubt that the reason why Digby remained historically and historiographically marginal is because the Catholic Digby used his natural philosophy to promote “particular religious views” in a “dangerous way” (66). After Spinoza this kind of subservience of philosophy to theology may seem in bad taste, although Henry fails to note that analytic philosophy has been more welcoming to those whose philosophy seems also designed to promote particular religious views (Analytical Thomism, Plantinga, etc).

The chapter on Theophilius Gale is the most interesting chapter on the outsiders because Gale’s Court of the Gentiles is itself a history of philosophy — a genre that became very popular in the seventeenth century. Stephen Pigney argues that one of the crucial issues in Gale’s history is to trace the claims of human reason and divine relation, that is, to mark out the proper “relationship between philosophy and theology” (85). Gale’s “covenant theology” assumed there was “an unfolding history of human salvation”, that is, meaning in history. Gale’s sensibility about history is alive and well among certain Continental figures, but this goes unnoticed. Gale’s turn to history was, in part, motivated by his “misgivings about contemporary philosophy” (93). Pigney ends his chapter with a tantalizing observation — noting that leading members of the Royal Society were inspired by Gale’s work to promote a philosophical history of their Society so it could be “written into the history of philosophy and the philosophical canon” (93). Pigney leaves it to the reader to note that the Royal Society’s subsequent propaganda success was so great that post-Kant philosophers saw its history as only tangentially theirs, leaving it to scientists and their historians.

* * * * *

In conclusion, a few comments on the chapters on the insiders.

All three papers on Descartes focus on Descartes’ twentieth-century reputation as everybody’s favorite philosophical villain. Tom Sorrell distinguishes between “history of philosophy” as a “historical enterprise” and as a “philosophical enterprise” (154). The contextual “historical enterprise” is “often philosophically boring” (154). The “remoulding” of historical figures that results from ahistorical history of philosophy often leads to “caricature” (154). Disarmingly, Sorrell sides with caricature, “for the sake of relevance” (154). However, Sorrell wants to reject the caricature he detects in Heidegger and Wittgenstein who take Descartes as a totemic model for all kinds of enduring philosophic mistakes and problems. Sorrell’s proposed solution is to advocate a “bridging work in which what is still defensible in ”SpellE">Cartesianism from a twenty-first-century point of view is presented as a live and general philosophical position to as wide a philosophical audience as possible." Yet, Sorrell’s “defensible common ground” is the same ahistorical, piecemeal method that Ayers identifies with standard analytic historiography.

John Cottingham attacks what he calls the “secularizing view of Descartes” (172). His main argument against it is that it mistakenly “compartmentalises [Descartes’] system” (172). Cottingham fails to engage with any of the writings by, say, Gary Hatfield or Catherine Wilson, who have done much to promote the view that the point of Descartes’ metaphysics is to get theology out of physics. In fact, judging by his citation practices, Cottingham seems largely uninterested in what other scholars have said on the matters discussed by him.

Emmanuel Faye wishes to rehabilitate a “humane and philosophical approach to Descartes’ philosophy and the modern philosophy which preceded it” (189). He sets out to reveal the political and Nazistic animus behind Heidegger’s anti-Cartesianism. Along the way Heidegger’s attempt to locate “the Cartesian metaphysics of liberty in a scholastic and theological context” is discredited through innuendo and ad personam arguments. Faye claims that Heidegger is following the lead of Gilson’s reading of Descartes (thus unoriginal, (178-9)) and draws on Uexkull’s idea of an Umwelt (thus racist because Uexkull was the editor of the race theorist H.S. Chamberlain (181)). Faye is so eager to discredit Heidegger that he fails to stop to consider how banal the Gilson-Heidegger reading of Descartes has become among scholarly commentators of Descartes; much of the best and by now quite standard (and non-Heideggerian) recent work on Descartes takes for granted that Suarez and Aquinas are indispensable background knowledge.

The two pieces on Hobbes focus on his reputation in twentieth-century philosophy. Sorrell offers empirical evidence to show that Hobbes is generally not taught in courses on early modern metaphysics and epistemology (197). Of course, the first two parts of Hobbes’ Leviathan are widely taught in courses on political philosophy (200), but then often in terms of meta-ethical concerns rather than Hobbes’ own normative ethics (204). Sorrell rightly claims that Leviathan gives an unrepresentative introduction to Hobbes’ “general philosophy, his metaphysics and epistemology, and his natural philosophy” (201). Sorrell’s considered judgment seems to be that Hobbes systematic philosophical views would not merit much interest anyway (193). Of course, Hobbes’ absence from the philosophical cannon means that undergraduates are not introduced to the historical roots of physicalism. In his introduction to the volume, Rogers claims that “throughout the eighteenth century [Hobbes] was largely ignored” (12) — a strange claim because in Scotland, Hume, Adam Smith, and Thomas Reid (not to mention Rousseau in France) all devote considerable resources to combating and distancing themselves from Hobbes. Part of the excitement within the whole of early modern philosophy is caused by the (material) ghostly shadow of Hobbes.

Luc Foisneau offers a brilliant rereading of Foucault’s complex relationship to Hobbes (as presented in Foucault’s 1976 lectures). In doing so he manages to get crucial aspects of both thinkers in clear vision. Foisneau lays out how Foucault wishes to do away with a focus on sovereignty because it legitimizes domination (209) and effaces how “disciplinary power” operates (210). On Foisneau’s reading, Foucault mines the history of philosophy of Hobbes’ time for a philosophical strategy that evades Hobbes’ conceptual apparatus — to be precise, historically Hobbes gives a new meaning to sovereignty in order to escape historicizing “”SpellE">historico-political discourses" that viewed law as permanent struggle between groups (215). Foucault’s insight is that “”SpellE">Hobbesian state of war is not a battlefield on which people are killed, but a system of representations … [of] wills. … It is not real war, but an abstract state of human relations" (216). Of course, these are not Kantian pure wills; “it is fear that motivates the will to acknowledge a sovereign” (217). Foisneau then turns to a close reading of the crucial chapter 13 of Leviathan to vindicate Foucault’s reading that Hobbes “does not use the thesis of international war except to prove … that it is individuals who are the real disturbers of the peace” (219). Foisneau also reminds the reader that Foucault’s alternative, historicizing project crucially revives a discourse of race struggle that has its own ugly subsequent history. Foucault plays with fire, and he knows it.

The two pieces on Spinoza are a study in contrast. Steven Nadler’s piece - in which he argues that Spinoza was an atheist not a pantheist - is out of place in this volume. While Nadler calls attention to John Toland’s (1705) equation of pantheism with Spinozism and makes a reference to the Pantheismusstreit, his piece offers straightforward exegesis. Wiep van Bunge’s chapter is a highly condensed, learned reception of Spinoza that is full of many fascinating details. It makes many fine observations on how after Spinoza’s death his friends constructed a corpus that would allow Spinoza’s work be untainted by personal matters (228). Van Bunge’s chapter circles around the importance of Spinoza to the self-conception of German Idealism after Kant as well as French Marxism since the 1960s. Van Bunge endorses the anti-idealist and anti-Platonist readings of Spinoza developed by Gueroult (225-6) and he rejects any attempts to link Spinoza to Jewish thought (229) either by Jewish scholars (229-30) or by Deleuzians (231). Van Bunge is surely correct that Spinoza’s vocabulary is much indebted to Descartes and Hobbes, but it does not follow that Spinoza’s views are. In particular, Van Bunge fails to note that the conceptual apparatus of Gueroult’s treatment of the attributes (and following him a host of analytic philosophers) distinguishes too exclusively between ‘subjective’ idealism and ‘objective’ realism — failing to consider, for example, that the attributes are co-constituted by finite minds and infinite substance. The details of such a reading cannot be explored here, but history of philosophy need never be mere history because its tools are always subject for critical reexamination.2

1 In his introduction (echoing his own past scholarship) John Rogers accepts the Enlightenment identification between Locke’s epistemology and Newton’s natural philosophy (14-15), but this ignores much recent scholarship that has focused on the incompatibility of Locke and Newton; see Howard Stein “On Locke, ’the Great ”SpellE">Huygenius, and the incomparable Mr. Newton’", Philosophical Perspectives on Newtonian Science, edited by P. Bricker and R. Hughes, Cambridge: The MIT Press; Mary Domski “Locke’s Qualified Embrace of Newton’s Principia” in Interpreting Newton: Critical Essays, edited by Andrew Janiak and Eric Schliesser, Cambridge: Cambridge UP (in press).

2 I am grateful for helpful comments by James Harris and Lex Newman.