Institution and Passivity: Course Notes from the Collège de France (1954-1955)

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Maurice Merleau-Ponty, Institution and Passivity: Course Notes from the Collège de France (1954-1955), Foreword by Claude Lefort, Leonard Lawlor and Heath Massey (trs.), Northwestern University Press, 2010, xxxi + 276pp., $32.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780810126893.

Reviewed by Rosalyn Diprose, University of New South Wales


Institution and Passivity is Leonard Lawlor and Heath Massey’s translation of Merleau-Ponty’s course notes for the two lecture courses he taught contemporaneously at the Collège de France in 1954-55. Also included is Claude Lefort’s lengthy and informative Foreword to the French edition. The volume is significant for several reasons. Appearing in French for the first time in 2003, it is only the second volume of detailed lecture notes from the twelve courses that Merleau-Ponty taught at the Collège de France to be published in any form.1 While Merleau-Ponty’s summaries of these courses have been available in French since 1968 (Résumés) and in English since 1970 (Themes), the more detailed course notes have remained unpublished until recently.2 Those who have been tantalized by the summaries of three courses on the topic of “nature” have had access to the more detailed lecture notes (two courses documented by a student and one by Merleau-Ponty) since the publication of Nature in French in 1995 (and in English in 2003).3 Institution and Passivity, to my mind, is more rewarding and coherent than Nature for the reason that it consists entirely of Merleau-Ponty’s own sequentially numbered notes, scrupulously compiled by Dominique Darmaillarcq, Lefort, and Stephanie Ménasé. The philosophical significance of the volume then is this: it makes available key aspects of the development of Merleau-Ponty’s thought in the period just prior to the penning of The Visible and the Invisible.

The first half of Institution and Passivity consists of lecture notes to the course entitled “Institution in Personal and Public History” along with the course “Summary” previously published in the Themes. In this course Merleau-Ponty is concerned with meaning, its institution and transformation; how sense is “deposited” in me and in social institutions but also how innovation arises. His interlocutors are the existentialists and phenomenologists, but also Marx, Lévi-Strauss, Freud, Proust, and Raymond Ruyer (whose study of “instinct” is also championed by Merleau-Ponty in his courses on “nature”. What characterizes Merleau-Ponty’s treatment of the institution of meaning here, in comparison with the Phenomenology of Perception, is that he includes consideration of the same structure of institution at all levels of “life”: animality and the organism, feeling (love), the work of art, knowledge, and culture. This allows him to emphasize certain aspects of the ambiguity of “institution” not so obvious in his earlier work.

First, in keeping with what he takes as Husserl’s notion of “institution,” Merleau-Ponty insists that meaning is not constituted by a subject, neither by consciousness nor by one’s embodied project (the latter claim is somewhat of a departure from Phenomenology of Perception). But nor is meaning determined by the sensible or material world. While “I am overcome [by the] thickness of the sensible” this is in the mode of “opening its beyond” (pp. 5-6). Meaning is both instituted (dependent upon being “exposed to” an already meaningful world) and instituting (involves “initiation” of the new, the opening of "a future"). Even though Merleau-Ponty had evoked an idea of the two-way institution of meaning in the Phenomenology of Perception with the terminology of “centrifugal” and “centripetal” sinngebung, here his interest is in the advent of meaning and its temporal dimension, the opening of the new within the familiar, within existing institutions. In other words, this course is about the historicity of the event.

The second emphasis in this course that I find interesting is the way that Merleau-Ponty’s consideration of animality and feeling in his unfolding of institution allows him to move away from his previous emphasis on the body-subject in Phenomenology of Perception toward his later notion of “flesh” in The Visible and the Invisible. Merleau-Ponty considers the “medium of institution” to be a disordered body described, for example, as corporeal “disequilibrium and anxiety,” affectivity (p. 24). Yet, this corporeal medium of meaning is neither prior to the social nor determined by it. In possible contrast to the Foucault of Discipline and Punish, “social roles” and norms are not “imprinted” on a body or its forces (p. 24). And, even though Merleau-Ponty takes up Freud’s Oedipus complex as an organizing principle for the institution of puberty, he seems to depart from the decisive role Freud gives to the family as a social institution in the organization of desire: there are no “social tracts” organizing a body, “no deep or real centering” (p. 24). Rather, what is decisive in the institution of meaning “is the elaboration which turns these anonymous ‘significations’ into moments of personal drama” (p. 24). Not only does this suggest a necessary diversity in the way meaning is lived among humans and across all modes of existence, but also it decenters both the individual and “society” with regard to the institution of meaning. The idea that neither society nor the individual provide either a secure foundation of meaning or a unified endpoint of the organization of corporeal forces invites comparison with Gilbert Simondon’s theory of “ontogenesis.” (A student of Merleau-Ponty, Georges Canguilhem, and Martial Guéroult, Simondon and his ontology are enjoying renewed interest in the wake of appropriation by Gilles Deleuze and Bruno Latour).

A third theme in the course on institution that I have not noticed elsewhere in Merleau-Ponty’s oeuvre is the attention he gives to a particular notion of “research” (also translated as “investigation”). “Research” arises as an issue because of the innovation that is characteristic of human institution: institution and its symbolic matrix are transformed “genuinely” in the mode of the “getting underway of an ‘investigation’” (pp. 18-9). Provocatively, Merleau-Ponty equates the event with “‘investigation’ in Kafka’s sense,” referring, for example to Kafka’s “Investigations of a Dog” (pp. 19-20, 77). He thus confirms the corporeal, affective basis of innovation, the presence of animal institution in the human and vice versa (pp. 19-20). Among other provocations, this scant reference to Kafka invites comparison with Deleuze and Félix Guattari’s treatment of the same issue in chapter 1 of Kafka: Toward a Minor Literature.4 Merleau-Ponty’s idea of research also confirms the historicity of the “event” that he attends to throughout the course notes: “Human institution always resumes a prior institution, which has posed a question, i.e., a question which was its anticipation — and which has failed” (p. 22). The research that is characteristic of human institution is steeped in a past, but, by virtue of a disturbance or initiative that is equally characteristic of institution, it is also open to an open future: "investigation, in Kafka’s sense, [is] an indefinite elaboration" (p. 77). Additionally, the feature of research that is characteristically Merleau-Pontean is that it is a collective endeavor. The putting into question of prior institution is a matter of engaging "the field defined by what has been surpassed" but also “reactivated,” not by oneself alone, but also by others, and not just now, but also infinitely into the future (pp. 11-12); the “intersubjectivity” central to research suggests “not only a plurality of views,” but also indicates the way that any “field” is already a “double horizon” “for others and not for me alone” (pp. 60-1).

The second half of Institution and Passivity consists of Merleau-Ponty’s lecture notes for the course entitled “The Problem of Passivity: Sleep, the Unconscious, Memory” and its “Summary”. The “problem” Merleau-Ponty addresses in this course, as he sets it up in the “Summary,” is similar to that of the first course: how to explain those aspects of experience that cannot be accounted for by usual conceptions of the “subject” as either exclusively constituting or constituted. But the focus here is less about forging a path between determinism and freedom in understanding the historicity and advent of meaning than it is explaining how personal experience is maintained through periods of non-consciousness such as sleep. Locke had cemented an enduring conception of personal identity by explaining these periods of apparent passivity by recourse to a notion of reflective consciousness, including memory, that is, to a waking, active subject who can reach back beyond interruptions to consciousness to past contents that it can thereby reclaim as its own. But Merleau-Ponty explicitly rejects the proposition that sleep consists in passivity alternating with periods of activity on the part of a reflective, constituting subject. Memory also needs explaining, as does dreaming. His solution to the “problem of passivity” then is similar to that offered to a theory of history: the lived or phenomenal body embedded in the “pre-objective world” (pp. 122-3) that allows the "preservation of potentialities, habitus" as it “reconstitute[s] itself” (p. 132). And, just as the phenomenal body is simultaneously instituted-instituting with regard to history, it is not sometimes active and sometimes passive: in terms that become more familiar in The Visible and the Invisible, Merleau-Ponty suggests that in both sleep and wakefulness “my activity is equally passivity” and vice versa (VI 139).5

While Merleau-Ponty engages with some of the same authors as in the first course (Sartre, Husserl, Proust, and Ruyer, in particular), what is particularly interesting about this course is that he elaborates his maturing idea of the activity-passivity of the corporeal self by comprehensive engagement with Freud’s work. This is how he explains dreams and memory. The course thus fills out scant references to Freud found in the rest of Merleau-Ponty’s oeuvre. The result is a rich and fascinating interpretation of Freud’s notion of the unconscious. Instead of reading the unconscious as a receptacle of representations of past experiences, Merleau-Ponty views it in terms of one’s corporeal, affective, pre-reflective relation to the past that also transforms the past toward an open future. Aside from notes on lectures about the “True nature of the Freudian unconscious” and the famous case of “Dora,” the volume includes appendices of Merleau-Ponty’s reading notes on Freud’s texts and concepts: “Three Notes on the Freudian Unconscious” and “Freud — The Interpretation of Dreams.” Reading notes on Proust’s account of memory are also included in the Appendix.

Just as interesting is the way Merleau-Ponty frames the course on “Passivity.” In contrast to his Summary of the course themes and in a departure from the Introduction to both courses, Merleau-Ponty’s introduction to the Passivity course focuses on Sartre’s distinction between the For-itself and the In-itself. Merleau-Ponty does this partly by way of locating the usual opposition between activity and passivity within his critique of the opposition between freedom (activity) and determinism (passivity) that is an overriding theme of the first course. But what is intriguing here is Merleau-Ponty’s suggestion of an ethics that may be derived from his ontology. Merleau-Ponty’s problem with Sartre’s opposition between the For-Itself and the In-Itself is the formulation of the For-Others arising from it: the For-Itself either “concedes everything to the For-Others” or “it concede[s] nothing to it”; Sartre’s ontology does not allow "that I accompany the other" (p. 120). An ontology that, contra Sartre, allows this fundamental intersubjectivity leads to a different ethics: while in Sartre’s ontology there is a “connection [to the other] that is a distance because it is created by me, … there needs to be distance that is a connection” and, while Sartre’s account allows “a ‘respect’ for the freedom of the other [which] is non-intervention of others in me, … it would be necessary to take responsibility for the other, not as infirm or impotent, but without rejecting from the other everything that one thinks” (p. 120). In the absence of Merleau-Ponty’s promised volume on the topic of ethics, the reader must resort to his or her own research in connecting this framing to the remainder of the course notes on “Passivity” and to other published works that follow.

There is so much about this volume that supports further “research,” in Merleau-Ponty’s sense. The course notes are meticulously compiled with clear indications of which notes the compilers and editors considered primary, which they considered revisions, and what they considered to be Merleau-Ponty’s reading notes as opposed to lecture notes. There are also copious footnotes explaining Merleau-Ponty’s references to other authors and their works. The translators too are careful to explain how they have rendered key terms such as “resumption,” “event,” “memory,” and “research.” Moreover, both the initial publication in French and this translation have been collective endeavors. Lawlor and Heath made their draft translation available to members of the US-based Merleau-Ponty Circle for its 2007 conference, which was convened by Lawlor and was on the topic of “Passivity.” Nine other Merleau-Ponty scholars scrutinized the draft translation and their suggested revisions have been taken into account. Not only does this suggest that there has been a sterling effort put into getting this volume “right,” but also it reflects Merleau-Ponty’s own sentiments about meaning and its transformation in the institution of a new work:

A book is a series of institutions and makes obvious that every institution tends towards a series… . It exists only at infinity as the sum of encounters of other minds with the work… . So that there is a genuine development (and not semblance of development), it is necessary that the new means become truly norms of the praxis, of the theoretico-practical landscape, and that the new lived-experience is measured in relation to them (p. 11).

1 The next (third) volume of course notes to be published in France is Le monde sensible et le monde de l’expression (The Sensible World and the World of Expression) (1952-53).

2 Résumés de cours, Collège de France 1952-1960. Paris: Gallimard, 1968. Themes from the Lectures at the Collège de France 1952-1960, J. O’Neill (trans.). Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press, 1970. O’Neill’s translation of the Themes is also published with Merleau-Ponty’s inaugural lecture at the Collège de France in In Praise of Philosophy and Other Essays, J. Wild & J. M. Edie (trans.). Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press, 1988.

3 La Nature, Notes, Cours du Collège de France. Edited by D. Séglard. Paris: Seuil, 1995. Nature: Course Notes from the Collège de France, R. Vallier (trans.). Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press, 2003.

4 Gilles Deleuze and Félix Guattari, Kafka: Toward a Minor Literature, D. Polan (trans.), Foreword by R. Bensmaïa, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1986.

5 Maurice Merleau-Ponty, The Visible and the Invisible, Edited by C. Lefort, A. Lingis (trans.), Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1968, p. 139.