Integrative Economic Ethics: Foundations of a Civilized Market Economy

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Peter Ulrich, Integrative Economic Ethics: Foundations of a Civilized Market Economy, James Fearns (trans.), Cambridge UP, 2008, 484pp., $117.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521877961.

Reviewed by Jeffery Smith, University of Redlands


In the Preface to the new English translation of Integrative Economic Ethics Peter Ulrich writes that "no other comparable overall conception" of how to integrate the study of ethics, economics and political theory "exists to date in the Anglo-Saxon literature" (p. ix). This claim, while somewhat of an overstatement, points to an important divergence between the ways in which academic study of business ethics has emerged within the continental European and Anglo-American traditions. Whereas debates in the English-speaking business ethics community have centered on the creation of moral business, centrally having to do with the moral development of management practices, Europeans have drawn upon a rich body of work in the last century that views ethical questions in business as a subset of larger questions having to do with the design of just economic and political institutions.

This basic difference in orientation is reflected in the original title of Ulrich's work, Integrative Wirtschaftsethik. The term Wirtschaftsethik (literally translated as "economic ethics") does not have an equivalent in the Anglo-American philosophical discussion. Indeed Ulrich and his colleagues take special care to distinguish Wirtschaftsethik from Betriebs- or Unternehmensethik, where the former denotes the study of ethical problems related to the design of economic institutions and the latter denotes study of ethical problems within the management of firms. His insight is that while separate, these two perspectives on commercial life are inherently interrelated, for the ethical nature of business conduct by any one firm is structured by the ethical nature of the institutions in which they operate. Ulrich's attempt at providing a holistic analysis of the interplay between the design of economic institutions and the behavior of individual market actors will stand as the most challenging, yet rewarding aspect of Integrative Economic Ethics for English-speaking business ethicists.

This orientation is also fused with what Ulrich views as an inescapable feature of contemporary Western market economies, whether liberal or socialist in orientation. Ulrich's work is a prime example of what others have recently termed "German republicanism."[1] Economic actors, whether individual or corporate, should not be conceived of as private actors seeking to further a narrow set of self-interested goals; rather, economic actors are always implicated in decisions and practices that can support or hinder the attainment of other public goods that are part of a well-ordered society. As such, economic activity in general, and economic actors specifically, are part of larger social arrangements that are in need of moral legitimation. This demonstrates the close link that Ulrich wants to preserve between historical work in "political economy" and contemporary business ethics. What we expect of market actors will be answered, in large part, by what is required of businesses to maintain and preserve the legitimacy of the free market as a device through which public goods are secured and protected.

Ulrich therefore begins the first part of Integrative Economic Ethics with a basic question: how should we assess market-oriented economic arrangements from the moral point of view? This question is motivated by a kind of skepticism that the social consequences of markets and market institutions have achieved their purpose of serving the good of humanity. Ulrich writes, "more and more people are beginning to doubt whether an economic rationalization process which is increasingly gaining a momentum of its own does actually operate in the service of life" (p. 2). He by no means intends the book to serve as a blanket criticism of markets. Instead he is careful to focus his attention on the way that markets can strengthen or diminish civil and political society.

Ulrich provides us with a method for answering this question well before providing us with an actual answer. His project is termed "integrative economic ethics" to underscore a contrast with other methods in business ethics. He resists many approaches that conceive of business ethics as "applied ethics" where the economic rationality of business firms is not questioned and ethics is seen as an "antidote" to unrestrained economic pursuits (p. 106). In contrast, integrative economic ethics attempts to redefine the normative aspects of economic activity itself. Building upon notions such as Ed Freeman's rejection of the so-called "separation" between ethical and economic rationality and Daniel Hausmann and Michael McPherson's claim that ethical commitments are always part of the individual choices made by economic actors, Ulrich maintains that the moral point of view prescribes a "different socio-economic rationality" that rejects the notion that practical reason in economic life is solely concerned with individual interest satisfaction. Integrative economic ethics "wishes to subject the entire normative substructure of … rational economic activity to … unconditional ethical reflection" (p. 109). His aspiration is to find an ethically integrated account of economic rationality that prompts economic actors to reflect continuously upon the normative legitimacy of their decisions.

To accomplish fully the task he sets before himself, Ulrich needs to dispense with the standard ways in which economic thought has defined such concepts as rationality and value. Thus, much of part two of Integrative Economic Ethics is spent criticizing the view that he refers to as "economism", or the notion that economic theory provides a "self sufficient" utility maximizing rationality that is "autonomous and absolute" and leads to "mutual advantage" for individual members of the economic system (p. 111-113). The basic problem, for Ulrich, is that while economism is correct in asserting that competition in the market will make "ethical reflection" unlikely (i.e., the pressures of competition will make it too costly for self-interested economic actors to embrace ethical behavior), it is mistaken to think that this is a necessity that we cannot change. Ulrich rejects the "rational determinism" of economism and argues that the presumptive autonomy of economic rationality is a contingent intellectual product of Western social history, rather than a normatively grounded assumption (as it is often cast) (p.136).

Part of what enables Ulrich to make this move is his use of "systems theory" as discussed by German social theorists such as Jürgen Habermas (p. 129). Anglo-American readers may miss much of the substance of this analysis, but it remains quite important to the development of Ulrich's attempt to provide an integrated normative theory of ethics and economics. Habermas draws an important distinction between modern society as a "lifeworld", where life is coordinated according to consensual norms that everyone recognizes as legitimate, versus society as a network of "sub-systems" designed to accomplish certain functional or instrumental goals. The economy is a sub-system of modern society where competitive exchange contracts produce "mutual" interest satisfaction for its participants. It is, in Habermas' terminology, a "functionally specified domain of action" that continues to expand its influence over the actions and thought of individuals.[2] Ulrich's critique of economism essentially maintains that the economic sub-system in modern societies is entrenched because its functional aims and internal logic have become immune to criticism. The goals of profit seeking and competition have usurped other spheres of the lifeworld thereby displacing non-economic norms in the coordination of social action.[3] The antidote to this current problem is to make the economic sub-system pervious to the norms identified in the lifeworld, i.e., norms that reflect shared insight into how coordinated social action can be made just. Thus Ulrich concludes that

the institutional political decision as to where the market should rule … always requires justification and legitimation … for the same reason, in a truly free society, the social intentions and ends pursued through the rule of the market must always be open to criticism (p. 131).

Ulrich's use of the concept of "lifeworld" plays an important function. First, citizens within the lifeworld engage one another as equally dignified members of a society where each is to receive basic levels of respect and recognition. Second, the terms of legitimate social cooperation are defined by dialogic interactions among citizens. This harkens back to Ulrich's earlier endorsement of Habermas and Karl Otto Apel's "discourse" or "communicative" ethics whereby the moral legitimacy of social arrangements rests on the support those arrangements receive from norms that everyone can, in principle, endorse.[4] To the extent that economic activity is a "social event", not merely an iterated sequence of private exchanges, Ulrich maintains that it is an integral feature of society as a lifeworld. Despite the private nature of particular business transactions, market economic arrangements are "always subject to public regulation and justification" if they are to be seen as legitimate from the moral point of view (p. 217).

However, there is a significant problem still awaiting resolution. Supposing that Ulrich has made the case that economic activity stands in need of legitimation, he must still demonstrate how an "integrated economic ethics" can institutionalize the requirement that the moral point of view is taken up in economic life -- either by those institutions that regulate economic activity or by economic actors themselves. This task occupies the fourth part of Integrative Economic Ethics.

The moral point of view is assured when citizens, regulatory bodies of the state and corporations are seen as simultaneous, interactive "sites" of morality in public life (p. 269). Citizens, as political and economic actors, maintain both rights and responsibilities in this regard. On the one hand, they must be assured certain rights of equal standing in order to carry out their private aims alongside their roles as citizens who deliberate about the legitimacy of social arrangements. On the other hand, they have responsibilities as employees, consumers and investors to make decisions that are supportive of, and compatible with, the maintenance of social norms. When citizens collectively identify legitimate collective goals it is functionally important for the state to enact legal frameworks to structure economic activity that supports these goals. Regulatory bodies, thus, are a place where respect for morality in economic life is institutionalized. Incentives, enforceable proscriptions, rules, etc. are ways in which the state can administer and be answerable to the "republican" values identified by citizens in a critical "public sphere". Corporations, too, play an important role in facilitating the realization of publicly identified moral norms by developing their own strategies to uphold the ends of morality while simultaneously engaging in the pursuit of profit. When corporations cannot find solutions to moral problems on their own, moral norms provide reason for managers to engage state institutions critically to rectify such problems or, when possible, develop joint efforts with industry competitors to identify standards of operation that can prevent moral problems from becoming permanent features of the market.

This last "site" for morality will be of particular interest to Anglo-American business ethicists. Corporate ethics, for Ulrich, is centrally about the integration of moral and economic aims whereby corporate managers are constantly answerable to the norms identified by citizens:

Integrative corporate ethics sees itself as a permanent process of unconditional critical reflection and the shaping of sound normative foundations for entrepreneurial activity in the service of life (p. 409).

This is perhaps the most significant feature of the fourth part of Ulrich's discussion: corporations not only have responsibilities to be supportive citizens and work with other social actors to improve the conditions of legitimacy of the market, but they also have the duty to contribute to morally attuned action through their own operations.

The most natural way that this can occur is through management and governance practices that take seriously the rights and standing of each party that contributes to the success of the firm. Employees, investors, financiers, suppliers, local communities, non-governmental organizations and even managers themselves are corporate "stakeholders" in this sense.[5] Corporations are accountable to the creative integration of moral norms into their operation by opening social spaces that examine the norms governing corporate activity. The implementation of corporate ethics, then, is centrally about the creation of management systems -- e.g., behavioral norms, cultural expectations, incentives, evaluation methods and interactive processes -- that place value on the standing of each stakeholder "citizen" group while acknowledging their relative needs, interests and risks.

Ulrich is intentionally vague on what such a management system might look like; he mentions the possibility of a thoroughly democratic approach to the governance of corporations through stakeholder dialogue or even stakeholder governance boards. If these notions are effectively institutionalized one can only wonder to what extent the nature of the modern corporation as we know it today would fundamentally change.

Still, the theoretical foundation behind Ulrich's call for stakeholder management has proven to be influential, even if only indirectly. Stakeholder theory itself has been taken up by many scholars in management and business ethics since the original publication of Ulrich's book in 1997. What is perhaps most compelling and unique about his theoretical stance, however, is that he weaves together an entire program of Wirtschaftsethik where other stakeholder theorists in the United States have been narrowly focused on the ethics of how to manage firms within the bounds of profit maximization. Ulrich's call for corporate ethics as effective citizenship combined with stakeholder management is, at bottom, a call for us to see how the legitimacy of free market economies rests upon a nested set of social activities, all of which play a role in identifying and implementing norms of just social interaction.

Ulrich's work will likely receive mixed reviews in Anglo-American circles. It is complex and encyclopedic, and it relies on literature that most will not have studied. It remains nonetheless very important reading for business ethicists who are unfamiliar with twentieth century German conversations about social theory, economics and business administration.

[1] Andreas Scherer, Guido Palazzo and Dorothee Baumann, "Global Rules and Private Actors: Toward a New Role of the Transnational Corporation in Global Governance", Business Ethics Quarterly 16 (2006), pp. 505-33.

[2] Jürgen Habemas, The Theory of Communicative Action Volume 2: Lifeworld and System -- A Critique of Functionalist Reason, translated by Thomas McCarthy (Boston: Beacon Press, 1984), p. 115.

[3] Compare with Elizabeth Anderson, Value in Ethics and Economics (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1995), pp. 143-63.

[4] Jürgen Habermas, Moral Consciousness and Communicative Action, translated by Christian Lenhardt and Shierry Nielson (Cambridge: MIT Press, 1990).

[5] See R. Edward Freeman, "The Politics of Stakeholder Theory: Some Future Directions", Business Ethics Quarterly 4 (1994), pp. 401-21 and "The Stakeholder Approach Revisited", Zeitschrift für Wirtschafts- und Unternehmensethik 5 (2004), pp. 228-41.