Integrity and the Virtues of Reason: Leading a Convincing Life

Placeholder book cover

Greg Scherkoske, Integrity and the Virtues of Reason: Leading a Convincing Life, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 264pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107000674.

Reviewed by Andrea C. Westlund, University of Wisconsin-Milwaukee


Integrity is a frequently invoked virtue in both public and private life. As Greg Scherkoske points out, we tend to admire people of integrity even when we do not agree with their views or share their convictions. And we tend to think poorly of those who readily abandon, compromise, or betray their convictions in the face of disagreement, social pressure, or temptation. It is commonly thought that integrity is a matter of having firm convictions and sticking to them even in challenging circumstances. But, we also recognize that sticking to one's convictions is not always admirable, and sometimes verges on dogmatism or pig-headedness. We admire those who are able to admit their mistakes, re-evaluate their firmly held convictions, and adjust them as needed. How are we to reconcile these reactions in a coherent conception of integrity?

Scherkoske argues that integrity is expressed not in fidelity to one's convictions per se but, rather, in fidelity to the aim of having only defensible convictions that are worth acting on and affirming to others. Persons of integrity seek to have correct, justifiable convictions, and have appropriate regard for their own ability to identify such convictions. They are reliably disposed both to act on their (reasoned) convictions, and also to take challenges to those convictions seriously. Furthermore, they accept the discursive responsibilities they incur in professing their convictions to others; they are willing, when challenged, to offer to others the reasons on the basis of which they hold those convictions. Individuals with these characteristics lead "convincing lives", as Scherkoske puts it. They have developed a resilient set of convictions that are reasoned and refined through critical reflection and argument with others. These convictions constitute a point of view that is distinctively their own, and also make them a trustworthy source of reasons to others. Because of this, persons of integrity are sought out and valued as advisors, mentors, and friends.

Scherkoske argues that integrity, thus understood, is a social epistemic virtue. In arguing that integrity is an epistemic virtue, he counters the more commonly held view that it is a moral virtue. He uses as a springboard an argument from Bernard Williams, to the effect that integrity cannot be a moral virtue because it lacks a distinctive thought or motivation. Unlike other virtues, Williams argues, integrity does not give rise to a distinctive motive to act, but, rather, "enables one to act from desirable motives in desirable ways" (cited in Scherkoske, 73). Likewise, integrity is not associated with a particular thought but, rather, with thoughts about whatever particular projects one is committed to, and in the pursuit of which one may exhibit integrity. Whereas Williams suggests that integrity lacks a distinctive thought and motive because it is not a virtue at all, Scherkoske argues that it lacks a distinctive thought and motive because it is an epistemic rather than a moral virtue. By an epistemic virtue, Scherkoske means "a stable disposition that reliably places its possessor in good epistemic position and leads to cognitive success" (84). Unlike moral virtues, he argues, epistemic virtues (or "excellences of epistemic agency") do not characteristically give rise to distinctive thoughts or motives. Instead, they are better understood as "reason-responsive epistemic habits, skills and practices that reliably place their possessors in good epistemic position" (90).

The various habits, skills and practices that constitute integrity as an epistemic virtue are fleshed out in greater detail in the book's central chapters, 4 and 5. Chapter 4 focuses primarily on the question of what it is to exhibit proper regard for one's own judgement. Our current beliefs and intentions depend extensively on "borrowings" from others and from our earlier selves, a reality to which we tend to respond with what Scherkoske calls "epistemic conservatism" of two varieties: doxastic inertia (a tendency to persist in our settled beliefs without reconsideration) and stability of intention (a tendency to persist in our settled intentions and plans without redeliberation). At the same time, Scherkoske argues, disagreement and challenge from our epistemic peers places us under some rational (not just psychological) pressure to reconsider our convictions. The person of integrity is one who responds appropriately to both forms of pressure, remaining resolute where she should but reconsidering her convictions as warranted. She has "well-placed self-trust", which involves a disposition to recognize and rely appropriately on her own epistemic capacities and expertise, along with a disposition to defer selectively and appropriately to the expertise and skill of others.

This interplay between self and other highlights the social element of integrity as a social epistemic virtue. Scherkoske describes integrity as "an essentially social virtue of persons relating to one another with the shared goal of achieving correct views about the practical question of what is worth doing" (108). Instead of aligning integrity with independence or autonomy of judgement, Scherkoske's social conception of the virtue takes seriously the fact of epistemic dependence and the necessity of intellectual trust in oneself and others.

Chapter 5 focuses on the performative and communicative dimensions of integrity, thus illustrating another dimension of integrity's social and relational nature. Integrity inspires people to engage in a class of related speech acts to which Scherkoske refers as interlocutorial performatives (or IP's), a class that includes acts of asserting, telling, advising, promising, and more. Drawing on Richard Moran, Gary Watson, Edward Hinchman, and others, Scherkoske argues that what these various IP's have in common is that they are all offered as assurances, intended to give others reasons that weigh directly in their deliberations about what to do or believe (157). In assuring another, a person "gives her word" that such-and-such is the case, or that such-and-such is to be done, and assumes responsibility for the reasons she purports to give to her addressee. While all of us routinely undertake various IP's, and thus offer assurances to others, the person of integrity exhibits a characteristic excellence in doing so. Her word is good; her assurances are qualitatively better than the assurances of a person lacking integrity. This underwrites the distinctive value we attach to integrity: as noted above, Scherkoske explains our tendency to seek out persons of integrity as friends and advisors in terms of the fact that we recognize them as trustworthy sources of reasons.

Scherkoske argues that his conception of integrity as a social epistemic virtue better accommodates a range of intuitions or "data points" about integrity that he set out in his first chapter, including both its "stickiness" (i.e., its association with sticking to one's convictions) and its reasons-responsiveness (the idea that we must distinguish integrity from dogmatism or pig-headedness). He also argues that his conception provides a better account of integrity's value (in terms of being a trustworthy source of reasons) and its distinctiveness as a virtue (it does not just collapse into honesty, truthfulness, or some aggregate of related virtues).

Finally, Scherkoske argues in the last two chapters of the book that his conception of integrity allows for a more nuanced and less antagonistic view of the relationship between impartial morality and integrity than some competing views would suggest. These chapters contain an interesting discussion of Bernard Williams's well-known integrity objection to impartial moral theories. Scherkoske finds the objection unconvincing even in its canonical form, but he also argues that, on his own conception of integrity, the apparent tension between the demands of integrity and the demands of morality should be seen in a different light. A person of integrity might well struggle with the problem of how to reconcile various competing demands in a "morally decent yet personally satisfying life" (212), but given that she aims to have and act on only defensible convictions, she will be motivated to consider all reasons that bear on the question of what to do. Scherkoske suggests that persons of integrity might reach different conclusions about how properly to reconcile competing demands -- after all, what persons of integrity share is a commitment to an aim, rather than a commitment to a particular set of convictions or principles -- but each will strive to give moral (and all other) considerations their due.

The view of integrity that Scherkoske defends is quite attractive on the whole. I find it compelling in its attention to the discursive responsibilities we take on in offering reasons to others, and in its recognition of the importance of responsiveness to disagreement and challenge. He rightly insists that integrity cannot plausibly be understood simply as a matter of sticking to one's convictions, come what may, however entrenched this idea might be in our less careful uses of the term. He deftly reveals weaknesses and draws on strengths in other leading accounts, which are helpfully categorized and reviewed in earlier chapters of the book.

What seems most controversial in Scherkoske's argument is the claim that integrity, as he characterizes it, is an exclusively epistemic virtue. Scherkoske (drawing on Williams) raises compelling objections to the idea that integrity is a distinctively moral virtue on the model of honesty, benevolence, charity, and the like. The argument that it consists instead in a set of reasons-responsive skills, habits, and practices is persuasive. But even in Scherkoske's own presentation of this idea, integrity's reasons-responsiveness appears to have two sides: an epistemic side, concerning reasons for belief, and a practical side, concerning reasons to act. Presumably the person of integrity must be appropriately reasons-responsive in both dimensions. What Scherkoske calls "epistemic" conservatism is dual-sided as well, including not just doxastic inertia but stability of intention. Someone with well-placed self-trust will need to know when to rely on her own practical and epistemic judgment, as well as when to exercise selective deference to practical as well as epistemic authorities. Likewise, some of her assurances will purport to give others epistemic reasons, and some practical reasons. The discursive responsibilities she undertakes, in her IP's, will thus commit her to answerability in both epistemic and practical domains. Why, then, think that integrity is an epistemic as opposed to a practical virtue?

Scherkoske addresses an apparently related objection in Chapter 4, namely, that regarding integrity as an epistemic virtue may not seem to do justice to its practical side. He argues in reply that integrity as an epistemic virtue has clear practical implications, including readiness to stand up for and act on our convictions and to accept discursive responsibilities for them. But this response does not seem to get to the heart of the matter, since it still treats the practical side of our reasons-responsiveness as subordinate or secondary to the epistemic side. Perhaps Scherkoske accepts the view that practical reasoning is distinct from theoretical reasoning only in its subject matter -- that is, only insofar as it concerns a special realm of normative facts -- and that what practical reasoning yields is not (directly) intentions, plans, or actions, but beliefs about what we have reason to do. Acceptance of this sort of view could explain why he is happy to treat the skills, habits, and practices of good practical reasoners and trustworthy advisors as excellences of epistemic agency. But this position is not explicitly argued in the book, and Scherkoske could, I think, say most of what he wants to say about integrity without taking a position in this background debate. He could, in particular, argue that integrity is a social virtue of rational agents that has both practical and epistemic applications -- a thesis that I would find quite compelling.

Scherkoske's book makes a distinctive contribution to the literature on integrity, and touches on a greater number of related debates than I've had space to explore here. It will reward close reading by those interested not only in integrity itself, but also in virtue theory more generally, the epistemology of disagreement, the epistemology of testimony, speech act theory, and normative ethics. Scherkoske's writing is a model of constructive engagement with his many philosophical interlocutors. The book's breadth of scope leads to some sacrifices in terms of depth (some of Scherkoske's treatments of the literature are unavoidably compressed and presented at a high level of abstraction). But his conception of integrity, and of what it takes to lead a "convincing life", points in a very interesting and promising direction and is deserving of serious consideration.