Intellectual Virtues: An Essay in Regulative Epistemology

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Robert C. Roberts and W. Jay Wood, Intellectual Virtues: An Essay in Regulative Epistemology, Oxford University Press, 2007, 329pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199283675.

Reviewed by Jason Baehr, Loyola Marymount University


Intellectual Virtues is a major contribution to the literature in "character-based" virtue epistemology.[1] It is the first book-length monograph on the topic to appear since the publication of Linda Zagzebski's groundbreaking work Virtues of the Mind over a decade ago. And in some ways, it is even more innovative than Zagzebski's book. The focus of the latter is a virtue-based analysis of knowledge, which Zagzebski argues has the resources for overcoming the Gettier problem, rebutting the skeptic, reconciling internalism and externalism, and more. As such, it is largely an attempt to engage and "solve" the problems of traditional or mainstream epistemology by appeal to the concept of intellectual virtue. Roberts and Wood have no such interest. While mainstream analytic epistemology is their starting point, and while its concepts and key players loom in the background throughout the book, they are interested in understanding the intellectual virtues and their role in the intellectual life considered in their own right -- independent of whatever bearing reflection on these traits may (or may not) have on more traditional epistemological pursuits. Thus their book departs even further than Zagzebski's from the status quo in epistemology.

Another important and highly distinctive feature of the book is alluded to in the subtitle. Drawing on some of Nicholas Wolterstorff's work (1996) on John Locke's epistemology, Roberts and Wood describe their methodology in the book as "regulative epistemology." They contrast this approach with "analytic epistemology," which "aims to produce theories of knowledge, rationality, warrant, justification, and so forth, and proceeds by attempting to define these terms" (20). Analytic epistemology, they say, is occupied with "concept regimentation" executed in a "monistic, reductive, hierarchical, or derivational style" (23). They argue that this method has generated numerous intractable debates and spawned theories that are "confusing and pedantic" (26). Regulative epistemology, by contrast, the ostensible forebears of which include Descartes and Locke, "tries to generate guidance for epistemic practice." It is "a response to perceived [perennial] deficiencies in people's conduct, and thus is strongly practical and social, rather than just an interesting challenge for philosophy professors and smart students. This kind of epistemology aims to change the (social) world" (21). A distinctive epistemological method indeed!

The primary medium of the sort of regulative epistemology that interests the authors is descriptive characterizations of "the habits of mind of the epistemically rational person" (22).[2] Accordingly, seven of the book's twelve chapters (Chs. 6-12) are comprised of detailed analyses of individual virtues (e.g. love of knowledge, firmness, humility, autonomy, etc.). But these chapters do not aim at specifying necessary and sufficient conditions for the traits in question. Nor are they driven primarily by any paradoxes or other logical problems that arise with attempts to understand these traits. Instead they aim at conceptual illumination and clarification; and they tend to highlight the richer, more concrete, and sometimes incidental features of excellent intellectual character. Roberts and Wood liken their approach to that of a cartographer:

Maps are pictures that are typically meant as guides to something or other. The present book means to represent the intellectual life in some of its conceptual messiness, and by virtue of this "realism" to function as a guide. We are particularly attentive to the character traits of the excellent epistemic agent. Our 'map' is pitched in that special way, and it is toward the virtues that it is especially designed to guide … Just as the cartographer can draw a map that highlights the railway system of a country, so in this book we want to map the intellectual virtues, without any pretension that they are the key or the foundation or the wellspring of everything intellectual. (27)

This approach may seem likely to strike many analytic epistemologists as off-putting or misguided, given their penchant for puzzles and paradoxes, conceptual derivations, formalized definitions, necessary and sufficient conditions, counterexamples, and the like. But two points are worth noting in response. First, the authors' "messier" and more particularistic characterizations seem entirely appropriate given their regulative aim. Attempts to formulate necessary and sufficient conditions for a philosophical concept can quickly become mired in technicalities and qualifications necessary for dealing with outlying cases, proposed counterexamples, and so forth (contemporary theories of epistemic justification are a case in point). Such formulations, while perhaps managing to capture the logical "essence" of the analysandum, often obfuscate some of its more familiar and concrete features -- including, perhaps, some of the features that might lead one to be interested in offering an analysis of the concept in the first place. As a result, these formulations are unlikely to function as a very good practical guide to the corresponding domain of cognitive excellence. (It does not follow, however, that the "formal definition" approach is philosophically problematic or defective -- see below.) Second, while the authors distinguish their approach from an "analytic" one, it is still analytic in a broad sense; and indeed, the book is likely to be of considerable interest to any analytic philosopher interested in better understanding the intellectual virtues and their role in a good intellectual life. The authors engage and draw a good deal from the epistemological and ethical literature in the analytic tradition. And the book contains many "conceptual proposals -- proposals about how epistemic and epistemic-moral concepts are related to one another, how virtues interact with and depend on one another, the varieties of intellectual goods and how they are connected with one another and with various virtues, the relations that virtues bear to human faculties and various epistemic practices" (26). Finally, the authors' profiles of individual virtues "constitute something like 'definitions'; at any rate, we aim, by way of our discussions, to make the concepts more definite in our minds" (ibid.). So for all that is distinctive about the book vis-à-vis analytic epistemology, it is still of a piece with this tradition.

The book is divided into two parts and twelve chapters. Part I (Chs. 1-5) situates the authors' subject matter within the landscape of contemporary epistemology (Ch. 1) and introduces several concepts crucial to the discussion in subsequent chapters. Chapter 2 enumerates various epistemic "goods" and the relations among them. Special attention is given to the goods of justification or "warrant," understanding, and acquaintance. Chapter 3 offers a rough sketch of what, in general, counts as an intellectual virtue. It focuses especially on the volitional and motivational elements of intellectual virtue. Chapter 4 examines the nature of cognitive faculties (e.g. vision, memory, introspection) and how excellences of intellectual character contribute to the proper functioning of these faculties. Drawing on some well-known work of Alasdair MacIntyre (1981), Chapter 5 introduces the notion of "intellectual practices" (e.g. observation, hypothesis testing, critical discussion, teaching, and reading) and of goods "internal" and "external" to such practices.

While largely aimed at setting up the discussion in Part II of the book, these chapters contain much that is interesting in its own right. Some highlights include: a discussion of the nature of understanding and its relation to propositional knowledge (42-50); an argument against a certain motivational requirement for intellectual virtue (71-80); and some very lively and engaging examples of how the intellectual virtues contribute to cognitive success (see, e.g., the extended discussion of Jane Goodall on pp. 143-48).

Roberts and Wood describe Part II (Chs. 6-12) of the book as "the heart of [their] study" (28). It consists of detailed analyses of the following traits: love of knowledge (Ch. 6); firmness (Ch. 7); courage and caution (Ch. 8); humility (Ch. 9); autonomy (Ch. 10); generosity (Ch. 11); and practical wisdom (Ch. 12). (As the names here suggest, the authors eschew a principled distinction between intellectual and moral virtues [60]. They prefer to talk instead of, say, generosity or humility per se. Their focus is the "intellectual virtues" in the sense that they are concerned with the ways in which the traits in question bear upon the acquisition and transmission of epistemic goods.)

The discussion in these chapters bears a close similarity to Aristotle's discussion of various moral virtues in Books III and IV of the Nicomachean Ethics. For each of the traits in question, the authors address the following sorts of questions: What are some of the distinguishing psychological ingredients of this virtue? What is it to manifest these ingredients in the right way, right amount, right time, and so forth? How is this virtue distinct from other, closely related virtues? Which intellectual vices correspond to this virtue? And how do they correspond? What are some of the systematic ways in which this virtue contributes to cognitive flourishing? Which epistemic goods does it deliver and how does it do so? Like Aristotle's treatment of moral virtues, the discussion in these chapters is engaging and intellectually satisfying. The chapters contain many subtle insights, illuminating reflections, and rich illustrations. Especially penetrating are the authors' intermittent discussions of the ways in which intellectual virtues and vices (perhaps especially the vices) pervade and shape life in the academy (see, e.g., the discussion of intellectual cowardice in academic departments on pp. 222-23). Other highlights include a discussion of various dimensions of epistemic value (155-64) and a rare account of practical wisdom and how it contributes to intellectual flourishing (Ch. 12). While at times the reader may find herself wishing that the authors would "go deeper" with respect to a particular issue or point, these chapters by and large have their intended effect: they serve to "build up" (30) or edify the reader by inspiring an interest in and admiration for the virtues in question.

In the space that remains, I will draw attention to three additional parts of the book, both with an eye to conveying more about its content and to offering some criticisms. My first point concerns one of the ways the authors attempt to motivate their preferred approach to epistemology. As indicated above, this strategy involves raising objections to more mainstream approaches. One such objection is that the standard epistemological concept of knowledge is an "abstraction" from knowledge itself (42; 55). It is not easy to pinpoint the complaint here; however, it seems to be that the pursuit of a formal definition of knowledge -- i.e. a specification of its necessary and sufficient conditions -- breeds narrow, abstract, and technical characterizations of the target concept. These characterizations, the objection goes, neglect various significant features or aspects of knowledge, and in doing so fail to reflect its richness.

As indicated earlier, I think Roberts and Wood are largely right about this. Thus I regard their more material and particularistic characterization of knowledge (Ch. 2) as a welcome addition to the literature. However, it is not clear why their argument really counts against the more standard approach to analyzing knowledge. Indeed, the authors appear to neglect a compelling and venerable motivation for this approach, treating it instead as a kind of aberration of late 20th century epistemology. Presumably what drives the attempt to specify the necessary and sufficient conditions for knowledge is a desire to get clear about the fundamental nature or essence of knowledge -- to specify what all instances of knowledge have in common that make them instances of knowledge. Surely this is a respectable intellectual motivation. It is, at any rate, an obviously and deeply Socratic one. Such analyses may tend toward abstraction and technicality, but to the extent that they are successful (and "success" here need not be understood in an all-or-nothing way), the payoff is significant. Moreover, their abstract character is (at least to some extent) to be expected: they are, after all, formal analyses, aimed at capturing in a precise way the very essence of knowledge. As this concern suggests, I am not inclined to think that Roberts and Wood score too many points against mainstream approaches to epistemology. I think a more plausible motivation for their view is simply its own internal theoretical richness and fecundity.[3]

A second worry concerns the authors' treatment of a "love of knowledge" as a discrete intellectual virtue. The authors' position here, as well as its implications for an account of the structure of an intellectual virtue, strikes me as awkward and problematic. On a more standard view (Zagzebski 1996; Montmarquet 2000), something like a love of truth or knowledge is a component of an intellectual virtue -- not a virtue unto itself. Incidentally, Roberts and Wood say a considerable amount that favors this alternative model and at times even seem to embrace it. For instance, they regularly point out that a given trait of character counts as an intellectual virtue only where it is supported by a love of knowledge (219; 239-41; 250; 265; 284). And they describe a love of knowledge as standing in an "encompassing and fundamental relation to the other virtues" (284) and as a "presupposition or necessary background of all the other virtues" (305). But given this systematic and fundamental supporting relation between a love of knowledge and other intellectual virtues, why not think of the former an element of any intellectual virtue, rather than as a separate or discrete virtue? This suggestion is reinforced by the fact that the intentional object of a love of knowledge stands in something like a means-end relation to the (immediate) intentional objects of other virtues. The immediate aim of intellectual courage, for instance, is to persist in a belief or intellectual pursuit despite a perceived threat to one's well-being; and the immediate focus of intellectual generosity is the liberal giving of one's cognitive resources. But intuitively, an intellectually virtuous person persists in the face of a perceived threat or gives of her cognitive resources out of a love of knowledge or some related epistemic good; she pursues these immediate ends as a way of achieving such goods (goods which, as illustrated by the case of generosity, need not be "her own"). This is suggestive of a more standard two-tier analysis of the structure of an intellectual virtue endorsed by Zagzebski (1996) and others, according to which an intellectual virtue is (in part) a disposition to pursue certain immediate intellectual ends or goals for the sake of ends like truth, knowledge, or understanding. But again, on this model, a love of knowledge is part of any intellectual virtue; it is not a virtue in its own right. While the question of whether to understand a love of knowledge as a discrete virtue or as an element of any intellectual virtue may, at first glance, seem relatively insignificant, at stake is an understanding of the fundamental structure of an intellectual virtue.

A third concern has to do with the authors' claim that intellectual virtues are "indexed to world views" (318) or to moral or metaphysical "outlooks" (180). Call this the "relativity thesis," since the idea is that intellectual virtues are in some sense relative to moral and metaphysical traditions. On a weak reading of this thesis, the claim is simply that which traits are regarded as intellectual virtues can vary from one tradition to the next. This is uncontroversial. It is a function of the fact that beliefs about which traits are intellectual virtues depend in part upon prior beliefs about what is ultimately good or real. The authors point out, for instance, that a virtuous love of truth is not an indiscriminate love of any and every truth, but rather a love of "important" or "worthy" truths (157-60). But what counts as a worthy or important truth -- or what is thought to be true or views about the nature of truth itself -- is likely to vary from one metaphysical or moral tradition to another: "Truths that are of overriding importance for the Stoic may not even be truths in the Marxist's opinion; nor will the theist's most important, and thus organizing, truths be of much interest to Bertrand Russell" (180). The authors' own work is a good illustration of this point: their commitment to Christian theism shapes and informs their views about intellectual virtue throughout the book (see, e.g., their treatment of intellectual generosity on pp. 288-92 and intellectual humility on pp. 243-50).

But a stronger and more controversial interpretation of the relativity thesis is possible. And at times, Roberts and Wood seem tempted by it. This is the view that what counts as an intellectual virtue is tradition-relative, such that if (say) a given trait is regarded as an intellectual virtue within a certain tradition, then it is an intellectual virtue (at least for members of that tradition). The authors' (albeit limited) sympathy for this view is evident in their treatment of practical wisdom. They claim that in its application to the intellectual life, practical wisdom is "oriented on action and presupposes a love for genuine intellectual goods." They add that what counts as "genuine" here must be "relativized to outlook" and that "[w]ithin limits, [they] want to be able to attribute intellectual virtue to a person with a systematically distorted conception of the intellectual goods" (307; emphasis added). Implicit in this claim is the idea that a trait's status as a virtue might (largely) be a function of what the subscribers of a given tradition believe about the "intellectual goods" -- not the nature of the goods themselves or the truth of any beliefs about them. To use one of the authors' examples, it suggests that religious faith might be an intellectual virtue for the theists but not for thoroughgoing naturalists. This is markedly different from saying that theists, because of their metaphysical commitments, regard faith as a virtue while naturalists do not.

This stronger version of the relativity thesis is the equivalent of a kind of cultural relativism about morality. And like the latter, it has some pretty unpalatable consequences. Suppose, for instance, that one's metaphysical outlook were such that only trivial truths (or worse, only "immoral" truths or truths about especially wicked or heinous states of affairs) are worth knowing. Would we really want to describe a love of such knowledge as intellectually virtuous? Or suppose that one's view of truth or knowledge is such that one believes that things like crystal balls and tarot cards provide the most reliable access to it. Would we want to think of a disposition to seek the truth via these means as a genuine intellectual virtue? Presumably not.

In fairness to the authors, they do seem mainly to favor the weaker reading of the relativity thesis; and when they express sympathy for the stronger reading, they do so with some reservation (note the "within limits" qualification above). Nonetheless, it is unclear whether their view of intellectual virtue has the resources to support a qualified or "limited" acceptance of the stronger reading. It would have the resources if it included a certain "rationality constraint" on intellectual virtue (see Baehr 2007). In general terms, this is the view that a person's disposition to pursue a particular epistemic end E via a certain means or activity A is an intellectual virtue only if this person has good reason to believe that E is epistemically valuable and that A is a reliable means to E. By accepting this constraint, Roberts and Wood could handle the sorts of cases just noted, since presumably the person who pursues the truth via her crystal ball does not have good reason to think that this will get her to the truth, and since the person motivated by a love of trivial or immoral knowledge presumably does not have good reason to think that such knowledge really is worth pursuing. I suspect, however, that given their resistance to a "one-size-fits-all" analysis of the structure of intellectual virtue (79), the authors would resist this proposal, for doing so would require thinking of the relevant kind of rationality as a necessary feature of intellectual virtue. But without recourse to something like this requirement, it is unclear how they can avoid the slide into a radical relativism about intellectual virtue. 

The foregoing are relatively minor worries. Intellectual Virtues is undoubtedly a very rich, novel, and important contribution to the literature in character-based virtue epistemology; it is, in fact, the most important contribution in the last decade. The book is a must-read for anyone interested in virtue epistemology and it is sure to enjoy this status for many years to come.


Baehr, Jason. 2007. "On the Reliability of Moral and Intellectual Virtues," Metaphilosophy 38, pp. 457-71.

-----. 2006. "Character, Reliability, and Virtue Epistemology," The Philosophical Quarterly 56, pp. 193-212.

MacIntyre, Alisdair. 1981. After Virtue (Notre Dame, IN: Notre Dame UP).

Montmarquet, James. 2000. "An 'Internalist' Conception of Intellectual Virtue," in Knowledge, Belief, and Character, ed. Guy Axtell (Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield), pp. 135-48.

Wolterstorff, Nicholas. 1996. John Locke and the Ethics of Belief (Cambridge: Cambridge UP).

Zagzebski, Linda. 1996. Virtues of the Mind (Cambridge: Cambridge UP).

[1] A "character-based" or "responsibilist" approach to virtue epistemology differs from that of a "faculty-based" or "reliabilist" approach. The central difference is that the former thinks of intellectual virtues as character traits like fair-mindedness and intellectual courage, while the latter conceives of intellectual virtues as reliable cognitive faculties like vision, memory, and introspection. See Baehr 2006 for a further account of the distinction.

[2] With Wolterstorff, the authors distinguish between "rule-oriented" (e.g. Descartes) and "habit-oriented" (e.g. Locke) varieties of regulative epistemology. Their concern is with the latter. 

[3] The foregoing is not the only argument Roberts and Wood offer against the traditional approach. They also point to (a) the apparent intractability of the Gettier problem (9-20) and (b) the plurality of epistemic desiderata (35-42) as spelling trouble for the traditional project of defining knowledge. But these considerations, even if taken as fact, arguably do little to undermine the real thrust of traditional epistemology. For even if (in light of the intractability of Gettier considerations, say) epistemologists were to give up trying to specify necessary and sufficient conditions for knowledge, other epistemic desiderata remain that are amenable to the traditional methodology and questions. This includes, but is not limited to, the concept of good epistemic reasons or evidence. This notion is not susceptible to Gettier worries; yet questions about the nature, sources, and limits of good reasons or evidence are easy to motivate.