Intelligent Virtue

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Julia Annas, Intelligent Virtue, Oxford University Press, 2011, 189pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199228775.

Reviewed by Erica Lucast Stonestreet, College of St. Benedict/St. John's University


Intelligent Virtue begins from what Julia Annas takes to be everyday thinking about virtue, with the intent of producing an account that puts virtue on a sound footing so that it can be considered a viable focus for ethical theory. The account develops two main ideas: first, that acquiring and exercising virtue is usefully comparable to acquiring and exercising a practical skill such as tennis or piano playing; and second, that virtue is part of an agent's happiness or flourishing. The project of the book is not to defend a particular virtue-centered ethical theory, but to sketch the composition and structure of virtue in a general way in order to provide a framework on which to build such a theory. Annas does this accessibly and persuasively, producing an attractive account both of what virtue is and how it is connected to happiness and the good.

The Aristotelian picture Annas provides is appealing in its own right, and because of its clarity and accessibility is also especially useful as an introduction to virtue and eudaimonism for those who teach about ethics. The treatment in each chapter of common objections to virtue-based approaches (often by showing how the complaints are not as forceful as it appears) maps out the territory well. The practicality of the account (a result of starting with common ideas about virtue), the emphasis on the development of virtue, and the skill analogy should have particular appeal to students, who are often seeking and clarifying their aims in life. The account gives readers a way to see their reflection on their lives as taking place within ethical space, without imposing artificial boundaries and requirements that are often perceived to come with other basic approaches.

A strength of Annas' account is that it carves a central place for intelligence without equating intelligence and rationality as such. She describes virtue as the active, persistent, reliable, and characteristic disposition of a person to think, feel, and behave in certain ways, which stems first from motivations we already have and is then further shaped by education and reflection. Motivation comes first, and judgment comes second. In short, "virtues are educated developments of our unformed motivations" (11). With this very basic sketch in mind, Annas develops the analogy between virtue and skill by arguing that virtues, like skills that involve what we might call expertise, have in common two features: "the need to learn" and "the drive to aspire." The main idea is that the learner of virtue must come to understand the reasons behind the actions the teachers take. Only then will the learner be making the correct decisions in new contexts, thus exercising her new practical knowledge for herself; this is true both for the exercise of a skill like tennis and a virtue like generosity. The ability to articulate reasons both in performing and in teaching sets the bar for both skill and virtue rather high. But reasoning in either of these contexts is not always explicit in the moment it is exercised. In both tennis and virtue, practice makes us fluent in a way that can efface conscious deliberation, even though the practitioner could explain retrospectively how she made her decisions. Thus, the exercise of virtue is intelligent in the way that expertise in tennis is intelligent, in the sense of being backed by good reasons.

A prominent part of the overall picture involves a departure from the skill analogy. Annas claims that, unlike skills which can be developed in isolation from one another, the virtues are unified. We cannot truly have one without the others because all virtues involve practical intelligence in their development from natural tendencies into full-blown virtues. Practical wisdom naturally has a unifying tendency because of its global scope; reflection on how to act in a given situation will typically take place against a background of the virtuous person's overall aims and values.

The unification thesis leads into Annas' discussion of the relationship between virtue and happiness. Annas frames the eudaimonist project as emerging from a natural progression of thought when we begin reflecting on the aims of our lives. If we play the child and continually ask why we are doing whatever we are doing, the answers bottom out when we get to "well, in order to be happy." Far from requiring that we think of happiness as something determinate at the outset, this approach to happiness quite consciously leaves the "final end" vague. Annas takes this to be a strength of the eudaimonist approach, since most of us could only vaguely specify what it is we're trying to achieve as we work to shape our lives into coherent wholes. Yet as she goes on to argue, this does not mean that any old conception of happiness will work. The question naturally arises, however, whether the eudaimonist has the right approach: Annas rightly asks whether her sketch of happiness matches the notion we have. After highlighting the ways in which her approach does match some of our everyday ideas about happiness, she treats at length some of the different candidates for happiness that have been proposed in both past and present discussions of the idea. Pleasure, desire satisfaction, and life-satisfaction are all examined carefully and satisfyingly refuted as substantive candidates for happiness in this picture.

Annas observes that this approach to ethical reflection naturally involves thinking about our lives in terms of structure, and tends toward unifying our aims. This is because our reflection necessarily takes place from our own perspective, and since we have only one life, we need to try to integrate all of our goals as best we can. Thus, the eudaimonist approach invites global thinking about our own lives, and this thinking is in turn active in the sense that its unifying tendency effectively shapes the way we live.

At this point, the connection between virtue and happiness becomes fairly straightforward. As Annas writes,

the different virtues . . . make up my character in various areas of life. Happiness, on a eudaimonist view, is the way I live my life overall. . . . Whether I live happily will depend at least in part on the dispositions I have developed as I have lived my life, the way these are maintained or decay, and their mutual interrelations (151).

Neither virtue nor happiness is at bottom a matter of the circumstances of a life, but rather a result of living it (a distinction which is central to many of Annas' arguments: roughly, the difference between the external situation and the internal decisions that take place within it to guide action).

The overall picture that Annas presents is appealing, sensible and cohesive. Where the account seems less satisfying, however, is in its generality. A reader can't help feeling a lack of detail in the discussion of the unity thesis, for instance, when Annas does not discuss the possibility of conflicts and how these are to be resolved. This raises the worry that the picture makes acting virtuously seem too easy, in the sense that it doesn't do justice to how hard it can be to discern the virtuous thing in some situations. The skill analogy might still be useful here, particularly if we turn to skills like engineering that may require deliberation and working within competing design constraints. Perhaps the psychology of innovative engineers may help illuminate the psychology of the virtuous person.

Still, even if we had a detailed understanding of the psychology of virtue, why think that all virtues will always be aligned in directing us what to do? What happens when (if?) two virtues call for opposing actions? "Developing a virtue," Annas writes, "is not a matter of getting ever sharper at comparing and assessing different partial claims and then working out an overall decision on obscure grounds" (87). Even for someone quite sympathetic to the thesis, it's not clear that this last claim is fully plausible; aren't we in fact sometimes weighing competing claims -- claims that could be based in the characteristic responses of different virtues -- against one another as we deliberate? Surely the virtue of practical wisdom does involve something like this weighing in the difficult cases. We must sometimes wonder what justice, generosity, kindness, and so on really entail in a particular situation. It may be kinder on a daily basis to rock my child to sleep, but in the long run I'm not doing him any favors if I don't work toward teaching him to fall asleep on his own, which may take quite a bit of courage and perseverance. Generosity to my students in the form of lengthy comments on papers may compete with generosity to my son in the form of extra bedtime stories.

Annas might respond that because all virtues involve the exercise of practical wisdom, they can never truly conflict; someone who was truly generous would know whether it was more appropriate on a given day to exercise her generosity toward her students or toward her son (the way a tennis player may know how best to return a clever shot). And it is not truly kind to my son to rock him to sleep every night. It is possible in the former case that either action is generous, and the search for the generous action is asking too much. The latter raises a new worry, however: does the unity thesis require us to define and understand virtues in a way that artificially departs from our everyday thinking about virtue (against the cornerstone of Annas' methodology)? If we always have to say about an apparent conflict that this is not actually what courage, kindness, or justice entails, then we risk blurring the boundaries of these concepts. Perhaps a more detailed discussion of individual virtues would alleviate this worry. And given the unity thesis, the worry as stated probably wouldn't bother Annas. Still, it is difficult to resist calling what a daring criminal does "brave"; if we don't call it that, aren't we departing in significant ways from our commonsense conception of bravery?

A related worry points to further vagueness in the unity thesis. Annas distinctly excludes industriousness from the class of virtues on the grounds that it is not, in itself, directed toward the good; a criminal could easily be hard-working. Traits that are truly virtues (as opposed to other kinds of admirable traits) reciprocally imply one another and are directed toward the good. This seems plausible from the examples she uses, but she doesn't push into less clear cases, such as courage and industriousness. It makes sense to say that benevolence may require courage, lest it fail at crucial times and thus not be true benevolence. But benevolence could similarly require industriousness. Furthermore, it's not clear how the converse holds -- how courage implies kindness any more than industriousness does -- and both of these seem to be useful to a criminal. If we want to get out of this last point by claiming that it's not true courage or industriousness that a criminal has, then what should we call the criminal's qualities? Annas might turn to the developmental aspect of her account and claim that there's no problem here because we can see the criminal as a learner, so that what she has is proto-courage, but if she is a criminal, can she plausibly be said to be learning virtue? It seems implausible to claim that someone who openly flouts or even rejects moral guidance is a learner of virtue. Equally implausible would be the claim that all criminals have simply made mistakes; the so-called mistake must be fairly conscious and deep-seated.

The criminal may seem to be organizing her life in a way that fits the structure of eudaimonistic happiness as Annas sketches it. This may lead to the worry that if eudaimonia is the thing we're all aiming at as we reflect on our lives, is everyone trivially happy? How do we make sense of the idea that some people aren't as happy as others? Clearly some people don't live as well as others. Do we claim that they aren't reflective enough, or aren't aiming at anything?

These all seem like surmountable difficulties on a fuller account of virtue. But there is another worry here. It is not clear from Annas' account that happiness must involve the goodness that virtue centrally does. This is surely part of the motivation for charges of egoism that are often leveled against virtue theories. Annas treats the egoism objection at length, framing it as a dilemma: either virtue (which by definition aims at the good) aims at happiness, in which case the account seems to conflate happiness with the good; or it doesn't, in which case it no longer seems eudaimonist unless eudaimonism is self-effacing. Her reply aims primarily at the first horn: understood properly, virtue's aim is clearly not focused on the self, and as soon as we recognize that happiness is not a determinate end, we see that there is nothing about happiness that requires a focus on the self either. Then there is no conflict between aiming at virtue and aiming at happiness. While this reply does refute the charge of egoism as such, it may leave a reader unsatisfied about the connection between happiness and the good. Discussion of this is left out probably because it moves toward the issues of the necessity and sufficiency of virtue for happiness, which Annas does not wish to tackle here. As a result, the account's generality again leaves the reader wishing for more detail.

Overall, Annas' account of virtue, centered on the analogy to skills, provides a unifying modern argument in support of many features of Aristotelian-style virtue theories. It leaves the reader looking forward to a fuller virtue ethics built on the framework.