Intentionality, Cognition, and Mental Representation in Medieval Philosophy

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Gyula Klima (ed.), Intentionality, Cognition, and Mental Representation in Medieval Philosophy, Fordham University Press, 2015, 359pp., $40.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780823262755.

Reviewed by Dominik Perler, Humboldt-Universität zu Berlin


It is well known that Franz Brentano took his inspiration from scholastic authors when he presented his famous thesis that all mental phenomena differ from physical phenomena because of their intentionality. It is therefore tempting to return to these authors in order to see how they worked out an account of the mental by referring to the feature of intentionality. However, this would hardly be an adequate approach. First of all, it is important to see that scholastic philosophers ascribed intentionality to all kinds of phenomena, including purely physical ones. Thus, they talked about the intentionality of fire that is directed toward the ignition of a piece of wood or about the intentionality of a picture that represents an object. Second, it is equally important to see that they took non-human animals to be purely physical things and nevertheless ascribed intentionality to them. They did not hesitate to claim that a sheep stands in an intentional relation to a wolf when it sees it, but they unambiguously affirmed that a sheep has no intellect and hence no mind. Third, in their attempts to characterize the mind they very often appealed to immateriality: what makes the mind so special is the fact that it is immaterial and hence immortal, not the feature of intentionality, which it shares with the material senses.

The fifteen contributors to this volume are fully aware of the danger of writing a teleological history of intentionality that simply leads up to Brentano and finds its point of culmination in his theory. They do not present medieval theories as attempts to define the "mark of the mental," nor do they see a unified conception. Jack Zupko aptly compares the medieval notion of intentionality to "a Swiss army knife" (p. 251): it is a multi-functional tool that serves different purposes in different contexts. One cannot understand it unless one carefully evaluates how it was used by a specific author within a specific context, quite often in close connection with other notions. And one needs to pay attention to the kind of state this notion was applied. Were the medievals talking about the state of an inanimate object (as in the case of the mirror), of a purely sensory animal (as in the case of the sheep), of a rational animal (as in the case of a human being), or of a purely immaterial being (as in the case of God)? These things exhibit different types of intentionality and require different types of explanation.

The volume presents a rich and nuanced picture of various types of explanation based on a careful analysis of crucial texts. The authors mostly focus on the intentionality of intellectual states in human beings, but they do not completely neglect other states. Martin Pickavé looks both at sensory and intellectual states, and Olaf Pluta deals with states in non-human animals. Surprisingly, no author examines the problem of divine or angelic intentionality. Strange and outdated as this type of intentionality might seem, it should not be dismissed, for it is in their detailed analysis of God and angels that medieval philosophers often worked out an explanatory model for purely intellectual states -- a model that served as a background theory for the assessment of human intentionality. It is also surprising that no author pays attention to theories developed in the early and high Middle Ages. They all discuss texts written between the mid-thirteenth and the mid-fourteenth century; Stephan Meier-Oeser and Gyula Klima also look at sources from the fifteenth and the sixteenth century. Of course, it was in this period that some of the most original theories were created. But one should not forget that the problem (or the cluster of problems) of intentionality was already identified as a crucial problem before the influential reception of Aristotle's De anima in the mid-thirteenth century, for instance by Anselm and Abelard. Their theories deserve as much attention as later ones.

The fifteen chapters do not present a grand theory about the origin and development of medieval theories of intentionality. Nor do they provide a general scheme that would make it possible to classify different types of theories. Klima points out some basic distinctions that were made by many medieval authors, for instance the distinction between "formal concept" (the intentional state as an act of the mind) and "objective concept" (the content of that act). Moreover, he makes clear that there was a fundamental disagreement about the semantically relevant features of intentional states: realists focused on their intension, nominalists on their extension (p. 329). This is a helpful way of classifying two approaches to the famous problem of signification. Of course, it is far from being a comprehensive classification of all the problems that were at stake in debates about intentionality. But this is not a disadvantage. On the contrary, as soon as one sees that the famous controversy between realists and nominalists concerned a specific issue in semantics, one can clearly distinguish it from other controversies that often went beyond semantics. Let me mention two issues that are discussed in two highly original chapters.

The first issue concerns the ontology of intentional states. It seems clear that the medievals took intentional states to be acts that are produced by the soul, in particular by the intellectual soul. Most scholars are less interested in the acts as such than in their content. They want to know what the content is, how it is caused, and how it relates a human being to an external thing. Giorgio Pini shows that this kind of approach provides a distorted picture of the medieval debate, for scholastic authors were as much interested in the ontology of intentional states as in their content. And there was no consensus about their ontology. Thomas Aquinas took them to be actions that are literally performed by the soul, and in his later theory he even claimed that these inner actions bring about their own product, namely a concept. This is exactly what the intellect grasps when it thinks about an object. By contrast, John Duns Scotus claimed that an intentional state is a quality that does not produce anything. It is rather an entity sitting, as it were, in the intellect. It is normally the outcome of a natural process of perception and abstraction but can also be directly created by God. It is on the basis of this quality that a special relation exists, a relation that makes a bridge between the intellect and an external object.

At first sight, the distinction between the action-theory and the quality-theory looks like one of those superfluous scholastic distinctions early modern philosophers scornfully rejected. Why should it make a difference if an intentional state is an action or a quality? Is it not in either case an entity in the intellect? Pini convincingly argues that it makes a huge difference, for the ontological theory has an immediate impact on the explanation of the way an intellectual state is directed at an external object (p. 93 and p. 103). If this state is an action, it is immediately directed at the concept it produces, not at an external object. If it is a quality that provides the basis for a special relation, it is immediately directed at an external object. Pini therefore rightly concludes that Aquinas and Scotus present two completely different theories of intentionality.

However, it is open to debate which theory is more convincing. Pini seems to have a preference for Scotus'. Criticizing Aquinas, he holds that the "very idea that an act of thinking is not directly related to its object is at first sight implausible" (p. 93). Perhaps. But it is not implausible to assume that an act of thinking is not directly related to an external thing when no such thing is present (e.g. when we think about an absent person) or when no such thing can be present (e.g. when we think about a fictitious character). And even when there is an external thing, it is not utterly implausible to assume that this thing is mediated by a concept. Thus, when we think about a cat we think about it insofar as it is conceived as an animal with a certain number of features. The thesis that an act is not directly related to an external thing does not necessarily lead to a devastating form of representationalism; it can also lead to a form of representationalist realism. Scotus seems to avoid every form of representationalism, but his position is not as harmless as it might appear. Pini remarks that "the intentional relation holding between an act of thinking and its object is a sui generis relation" (p. 101). So Scotus seems to posit a special relation that simply comes into existence when there is a quality of thought. But it is unclear what exactly this relation is, why it comes into existence, and how it is grounded in the quality. As long as these problems are unresolved, it remains unclear why the sheer existence of a quality in the intellect (which could even be implanted there by God) should enable a thinker to be directed at an external thing. In any case, Scotus' theory gives rise to as many puzzles as Aquinas'.

In his chapter on Peter Auriol, Russell L. Friedman discusses another important issue, the problem of appearance. Most medieval philosophers took it for granted that things can appear to human beings. They were mostly interested in the question of what human beings do once things appear to them. How do they grasp or conceptualize them? And how do they make judgments about them? Consequently, most medieval philosophers explored the cognitive mechanisms that are required for concept formation and judgment. Auriol was not satisfied with this approach, as Friedman makes clear. He wanted to know why and how a thing can appear to someone in the first place. His discussion of this crucial problem led him to the result that the mere presence of a thing does not suffice; otherwise a person standing in front of a wall would appear to that wall. Nor does it suffice that the form of the thing is somehow received; otherwise a person would appear to a wall as soon as her form is depicted on it. Something more is required, namely a "living, vital force" (p. 148) that pays attention to it. That is why no person can appear to a wall. She can only appear to another person who receives her form and pays attention to her; and only then can the process of concept formation start.

Friedman gives a detailed and careful reconstruction of Auriol's theory and thereby shows where its originality lies. Unlike most of his contemporaries, Auriol looked at the conditions that need to be fulfilled for the emergence of a concept -- conditions that go beyond the passive process of form-reception. And he gave a clear criterion for distinguishing real intentionality from pseudo-intentionality. A wall or some other inanimate thing cannot be really directed at an object because it lacks a "living, vital force" and hence an appearance. Only animals and human beings (and in some sense angels and God) have this kind of force and are therefore candidates for intentional states.

Friedman claims that Auriol's theory of appearance amounts to a theory of consciousness and that "consciousness is a more primitive feature in Auriol's philosophy of mind than is either cognition or intentionality, the latter being explained by the former" (p. 142). This is an interesting suggestion, but as it stands it is not completely convincing. Friedman does not spell out what kind of consciousness is at stake here. It cannot be phenomenal consciousness, for Auriol never referred to a special feeling; in most contexts he spoke about appearance as an intellectual phenomenon. Nor can it be access consciousness; Auriol did not simply talk about the availability of some information. He had something stronger in mind: living beings have an appearance when they are attentive to an object that is present to them. Auriol's theory is therefore more a theory of attention than of consciousness, as Friedman himself concedes when he remarks that appearance "has to do with the nature of the soul and it involves the will" (p. 149). Quite obviously, without the will and its focus on an object there can be no appearance. This means, of course, that appearance presupposes intentionality, for the will cannot focus on an object unless it can be directed at it. But then, it seems, appearance cannot be a primitive feature in Auriol's philosophy of mind. Perhaps he can be understood as presenting a two-level theory of intentionality. At a first level, a person picks out an object and steers her attention toward it, thus making it an appearing object. At a second level, she starts forming concepts about this object. Seen in this way, Auriol did not explain intentionality in terms of consciousness since both levels involve intentional activity. But his theory is still interesting because it shows that an adequate picture of cognitive processes is more complex than most of Auriol's predecessors assumed. These processes do not simply consist in the acquisition of forms and in the formation of concepts and judgments.

This example shows that the chapters in this volume open up new perspectives and give rise to further reflections. In any case, this rich and stimulating collection will shape future research on medieval theories of intentionality.