Intentionality: Past and Future

Placeholder book cover

Gábor Forrai and George Kampis (eds.), Intentionality: Past and Future, Rodopi, 2005, 190pp., $50.00 (pbk), ISBN 9042018178.

Reviewed by Tim Crane, University College London


Recent years have seen significant changes in the study of intentionality and mental representation. Twenty years ago, there was a fairly well-established research agenda, set largely by the work of Jerry Fodor. Those working to this agenda tended to assume that the study of intentionality is distinct from the study of consciousness; that the study of intentionality is the study of the propositional attitudes; that the aim of an account of intentionality should be to give a physicalist theory of it; that such a theory must in some way appeal to causal relationships between intentional states and the things in the world that they are about.

These days things look slightly different. While many philosophers still work to the Fodorian agenda, there has been an opening out of the range of questions and assumptions which are taken to be central to the study of intentionality. One important development has been the realisation on behalf of many philosophers that it is impossible to get a proper understanding of intentionality without understanding its relationship to consciousness. Particular efforts have been paid in recent years to the intentionality of perception. There has also been less of an emphasis in recent work on the reduction of intentionality to causal and/or nomic relations. This is not so much because all such reductions have been shown to fail; it is rather because many philosophers have turned their interest to the phenomena of intentionality as such, and the problems they create. In a way, this must be a good thing: for how can we perform a reduction unless we have some idea of what to reduce?

These developments in the study of intentionality are well exemplified by this collection, the proceedings of an excellent 2002 conference on intentionality organised in Miskolc, Hungary, by Gábor Forrai. Unlike many volumes arising from conferences, this volume has a nice unity. The eleven essays cluster around four related themes: the history of the concept of intentionality, the relationship between intentionality and consciousness, the intentionality of perception, and the nature of intentional content.

The recent history of the philosophical study of intentionality is often said to begin with Brentano's Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint, published in 1874. Philip J. Bartok argues that both the analytic and the phenomenological traditions have misinterpreted Brentano. Bartok nicely brings out the way in which analytic commentators have willfully misread Brentano's doctrine of intentionality -- for example, in taking the term 'intentional inexistence' to refer to the non-existence of some objects of thought (see Rey 2006 for a recent example of this misuse of the terminology). Bartok also argues that although the phenomenological tradition (especially in the work of Husserl and Heidegger) has gone too far in ignoring Brentano's more metaphysical moments, they are essentially correct in representing Brentano's project as that of 'descriptive psychology'.

In a similar vein, Shannon Vallor also contrasts analytic and Husserlian approaches to reference, and favours a Husserlian approach. Certainly there are many insights in Husserl's work (at least up until Ideas) which have been overlooked in recent philosophy of mind. But I must admit that Vallor's attempt to use Husserlian ideas to solve Quine's problems about substitutivity of co-referring names escaped me. The idea seems to be that names refer only in speech acts, and the contribution they make to the content of sentences in which they occur is not by standing for an object but rather by standing for a 'path of intention' to refer to the object. Since co-referring words can connote different 'paths', they are not always substitutable salva veritate. There is something to be said for this approach, but no more than was admitted by Frege in his own theory of indirect reference. As it stands, the idea leads Vallor into confusion: 'although they have the same extension, "Burma" has properties that "Myanmar" lacks (namely being under legitimate and democratic governance)' (p. 123).

Other papers range more widely. Greg Jesson discusses Frege's notion of sense and its origins in his philosophy of mathematics. Taking the history further back, Gábor Forrai looks at the presence of the notion of intentionality in Locke's Essay. Forrai argues persuasively that Locke's ideas should be seen as resembling intentional contents rather than as something more like sense-data (as they are often claimed to be -- for example, by Jonathan Bennett). Forrai distinguishes between what he calls an 'object' theory of Lockean ideas -- where ideas are the objects of the mind's attention -- and a 'content' theory, according to which ideas are components of what we would now call intentional content. Partly drawing on the work of John Yolton, Forrai makes a convincing case that Locke's theory of ideas is a theory of intentional content.

In the second half of the 20th century, analytic studies of intentionality were dominated by Roderick Chisholm's ideas (e.g. Chisholm 1968), and Quine's critique of them. In a careful and illuminating paper, Alberto Voltolini criticises Chisholm's 'linguistic' criteria of intentionality -- failure of substitution of co-referring terms and failure of existential generalisation -- and replaces them with his own variants. The most interesting of these is the claim that an intentional (or 'directional') context allows us to infer only an 'existentially unloaded' particular quantification, which Voltolini expresses in English as 'there is… '. In other words, from 'Jane thinks about Pegasus' we can infer only that there is something Jane thinks about, but not that there exists such a thing. The distinction between 'there is' and 'there exists' is certainly one which we often need in ordinary talk; Voltolini shows how it can also be useful for a theory of intentionality.

One striking consequence of the dominance of Quine is the neglect of the phenomena of consciousness when talking about intentionality. Quine's influence was widespread: on Davidson, Dennett and Fodor. In Dennett and Fodor, the dominant theme has been how to give a reductive account of intentionality: to explain how intentionality fits into the world as conceived by physical sciences. One aspect of the problem here is that the world as conceived by the physical sciences seems to leave little place for the normativity of judgement. In his 'Normativity and Mental Content' Jussi Haukioja addresses the statement of this problem given by Kripke's rule-following paradox.

The separation of consciousness and intentionality which (I claim) arose as a result of Quine's influence would look very strange to any follower of Husserl. Of course, Husserl did think that there were non-intentional elements of conscious life -- the sensory hyle -- and he also believed in unconscious intentionality. But the primary phenomena of intentionality are conscious experiences, including conscious thoughts.

Laird Addis is firmly on Husserl's side here. Addis has argued for some years that the contemporary analytic divorce between consciousness and intentionality is a mistake. Addis holds the strong thesis that only occurrent mental phenomena -- occurrences in the stream of consciousness -- have intrinsic intentionality. In his lucid contribution to this volume, Addis outlines some of his arguments for this position and for his view that intentional phenomena are 'natural signs'. He also has some illuminating critical remarks about the relation between this view and relational views such as that those of Russell and Moore.

Kenneth Williford's 'The Intentionality of Consciousness and the Consciousness of Intentionality' discusses some recent attempts by analytic philosophers to bring consciousness and intentionality together again. Unlike some of those (e.g. Colin McGinn) who think there is an intrinsic connection between these two phenomena, Williford does not think that the connection is an obstacle to a naturalistic reduction of mind.

Those who think that not all conscious states are intentional may think, with Searle (1983), that emotional experience provides us with clear examples of how there can be consciousness without intentionality: one can be in a bad mood, without being in a bad mood about anything in particular. In his very interesting contribution to this volume, William Fish disputes this widely held view. Fish argues that many emotions and all moods are not intentional states in their own right, so to speak, but rather are higher order modifications of existing states. He then proposes that the difference between emotions and moods is not in their intrinsic intentionality but rather in the way they are related to other mental states. Simply put, when a subject is in an emotional state they will 'invariably' have beliefs about why they are in that state; but this is not so with moods. Certainly there might be room for questioning whether this is the place to draw 'the' distinction between emotions and moods, but Fish's paper certainly provides us with an illuminating way to draw one distinction which is surely a very important one.

As noted above, it took analytic discussions some time to link together intentionality and consciousness. When they finally did, they tended to use the case of perception as a paradigm of intentionality, just as Husserl had. Two essays in this book focus on the intentionality of perception: János Tözsér gives an interesting and lucid account of the recent debate between intentionalists and disjunctivists in the philosophy of perception. The essence of the debate, according to Tözsér, is over whether what is available to the subject from their own point of view is sufficient to individuate a mental state. The intentionalist, according to Tözsér, will accept this, and thus count a veridical perception and a subjectively indistinguishable hallucination as being the same mental state; but the disjunctivist denies this. Tözsér clearly favours the disjunctivist theory, and attempts an argument for it at the end, while acknowledging that there is no knock-down argument in this area. There is a lot in Tözsér's paper from which students of perception can learn.

Howard Robinson has been one of the main contributors to the debate about perception in the last thirty years. He is perhaps the leading defender of the sense-datum theory of perception, the theory that in perceptual experience we are aware of something real -- a non-physical sense-datum -- whether or not we are also aware of anything in the physical world. The sense-datum theory seems opposed both to naïve realism (and its descendent, disjunctivism) but also to an intentionalist conception of perception of the kind described by Tözsér and defended by Armstrong (1968) and Anscombe (1965). For it seems to be of the essence of intentionality that intentional states can be about something that does not exist, and therefore not even be a relation to that 'thing' at all. Yet what the sense-datum theory says is that perceptual experience is always a relation to the object of experience, even when there is no ordinary outer object being perceived. So, they argue, the object of experience cannot be an ordinary outer object. In his contribution to this volume, Robinson argues that the sense-datum theory might be compatible with an intentional theory if the sense-data theory were to treat sense-data as the medium or vehicle of experience, rather in the way that words are the vehicles of thought. Yet it seems to me that the relation in which we stand to words, when we have thoughts in words, is not analogous to the relation we are supposed to stand in to objects of experience, when we have experiences. Although we do think in words, we do not think words; but the sense-data theory did traditionally say that we see (etc.) sense-data. So despite Robinson's protests, this does seem like a departure from his previous version of the sense-data theory.

The conference in Miskolc was extremely good, and although it lacks some contributions from speakers there, this volume is nonetheless a fitting memento. The papers are mixed in quality, but they discuss the problems of intentionality from many different perspectives and provide a refreshing alternative to some more traditional discussions.


Anscombe, G.E.M. (1965), 'The Intentionality of Sensation: a Grammatical Feature' in R.J. Butler (ed.), Analytical Philosophy: First Series Oxford: Blackwell.

Armstrong, D.M. (1968), A Materialist Theory of the Mind London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.

Chisholm, Roderick (1968) 'Intentionality' in Paul Edwards (ed.) The Encyclopedia of Philosophy London: Macmillan.

Quine, W.V.O. (1960) Word and Object Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.

Rey, Georges (2006) 'The Intentional Inexistence of Language' in Rob Stainton (ed.) Contemporary Debates in Cognitive Science Oxford: Blackwell.

Searle, John (1983) Intentionality Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.