Interactive Democracy: The Social Roots of Global Justice

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Carol C. Gould, Interactive Democracy: The Social Roots of Global Justice, Cambridge University Press, 2014, 293pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781107607415.

Reviewed by Ayelet Banai, The University of Haifa


Do progressive social movements, civil society associations, and ordinary citizens that rise against oppression, repression and dire inequality still have a chance? Carol C. Gould's new book makes a compelling case that there is room for careful optimism. This is an admirable achievement, especially in a time when political and socioeconomic circumstances grow darker in more than one corner of the world. Drawing on an inspiring breadth of philosophical and intellectual foundations -- Karl Marx and Pippa Norris, Emile Durkheim and Iris Young are only a few of the valuable sources -- it systematizes the links, in theory with relation to practice, between democracy, human rights, and social justice. By recovering and uncovering these connections, the work opens a gateway to reclaiming democracy by refreshing its emancipatory promises. It also contributes theoretical and action guiding insights to theories of human rights and global justice. The principle of "equal positive freedom" is incorporated into human rights theory as a guiding normative perspective that helps specify and prioritize human rights. In the context of democracy and global justice, the principle helps balance between democratic participation at the local, national level and cosmopolitan aspirations.

The theoretical framework is explicated in Part I. The book's normative perspective is rooted in "the fundamental recognition of people's equality as agents". But agency must not remain "empty or purely formal." Access to the conditions for effective agency is therefore also subject to the demand of equality (p. 17). A principle of egalitarian justice, thus, emerges that requires "equal rights of access" to the conditions for effective agency. This is the justice claim to "equal positive freedom" (p. 3). With the foundational principle in view human rights and democracy fall into place in an integrated theoretical framework. Human rights are justified and specified in view of the normative principle and connote universal moral claims to material, social and political conditions -- basic and non-basic for agency. The subjects of the human rights are "individuals-in-relations", not an individual in the abstract (p. 51-7, 84, 87). The chapters explore normative as well as sociological aspects of the foundations and justification of human rights. Democracy, as equal participation in decision making or a voice in the deliberations, is subsequently interpreted as a human right in itself -- a political condition of agency -- and as an important means to protect other aspects and conditions thereof. A long-called-for distinction is proposed between domestic and global forms and grounds of democratic participation (p. 87-96).

Part II, "The Social Roots of Global Justice", contains an extensive discussion of social and cultural realities and practices beyond the political aspects of human rights and justice, which connect abstract norms of global justice to concrete interactions and anchor normative principles in existing practices, and resistance to them. An impressively broad spectrum of issues unfolds in the chapters -- from gender inequality to the sociality of humor. Among them, the discussion of solidarity is particularly valuable. The discussion re-conceptualizes solidarity beyond a cohesive local and national community in terms of

the supportive relations we can come to develop with people at a distance, given the interconnections that are being established through work or other economic ties, through participation in Internet forums and especially through social media, or indirectly through environmental impact (p. 99).

Solidary relations of this kind take the form of transnational networks that connect the individuals and groups through practices -- for instance production and supply chains and care work (e.g., p. 112, 141). These solidarities are important due to their potential contribution "to the emergence of more democratic forms of transnational interaction" (p. 99) and because they are a condition that enables the recognition of human rights as well as their fulfillment on a global scale (chapters 6 and 7).

An immense advantage of this conceptualization of solidarities is in its ability to make sense of how justice, democracy and the fulfillment of human rights might be advanced. It does not leave individuals, associations and social groups overwhelmed in face of an impossible task but rather helps break up a gigantic and highly complex struggle for human rights and global justice into interconnected parts that seem to fall within the range of human possibilities. To be sure, the solidarities networks perspective faces challenges: the networks are often fragile and instable and rely on a picture of distanced realities that is too often distorted through media embedded in social, economic, and cultural structures. Nonetheless, transnational solidarities constitute an important, sophisticated and refreshing theoretical contribution, which carries an action-guiding promise.

Part III outlines the vision of "interactive democracy", where local, national, transnational and global modes of participation, decision-making, and deliberation interact. Interactive connotes not only the multiple sites of democracy but also its multiple modes and forms -- including various Internet based participations (chapter 12). Interactive democracy draws on the discussion and insights from the first two parts of the book -- namely, why and how representation and participation beyond (but not instead of in) the state. Furthermore, in this part too, we find perceptive analyses and discussions of constitutive parts of a long-term and massive project of creating interactive democracy -- for example, developments within the International Labor Organization.

In sum, Gould's book is a very recommendable read, and beyond the many insights that come to light throughout the chapters, it is an appealing invitation to a longer intellectual journey through her other work. It follows from the breadth, complexity and innovation of the book that it gives rise to further questions. I would like to mention three, from the specific to the general, that pertain to: suffering as a root of solidarity; the state in cosmopolitan theory and; the addressees of international ethics and normative theory since the civil war in Syria.

The discussion of transnational solidarities in chapters 5 and 6 relates solidarity to the suffering of others and the ability to feel empathy with them (e.g., p. 105, 114). Transnational interactions urge the better off to recognize the suffering of the worse off parties to the interaction and take joint action to alleviate their suffering. Though in most cases the better off provide assistance to the worse off, solidarity is importantly seen a mutual process, with a reciprocal dimension. The provision of assistance is not a one-sided act of charity but is informed by the hypothesis that, were pertinent circumstances to arise, the aid would be reciprocated. Indeed, the wrongs that transnational solidarities seek to rectify are shaped, to an extent, by international and global structures and powers that bring about wellbeing for some and deprivation for others -- the distributions of benefits and burdens are unfair and often arbitrary. Therefore, it is indeed important that the connection between the better and the worse off through structures of power is recognized and aid given under these circumstances is not seen as an act of benevolent altruism but as a mutual action urged by the interconnection (p. 116). The concern, however, is that the focus on the suffering of the worse off -- as their property that evokes the empathy of the better off -- makes solidarity vulnerable because the recipients of aid are then seen by givers as pitiable victims, not as potential partners for mutual action. It might be worth considering as source of solidarity in this context the recognition of the potential freedom and wellbeing of those currently worse off; the intuition that anyone could find himself or herself in their place -- in such a predicament that would require solidary assistance of others to overcome (p. 114).

The second question concerns more generally cosmopolitan theories, which focus on the transnational and global spheres -- beyond states. It is not raised here as an objection to Gould, but as an ensuing, and hopefully helpful, reflection. It may be the case that cosmopolitan analysis oriented to the global and transnational spheres overlooks the immense power of states, particularly powerful states, in these contexts. International organizations, actors and practices, from the WTO to large transnational corporations, may well have autonomy from states, but states -- in particular the powerful among them -- nonetheless play an immensely important role in shaping the transnational and global dynamics. If this is the case, cosmopolitan concerns may need to be tackled through national-level politics, and cosmopolitan theory may need to pay much more attention to the state level, and how governments' policies -- domestic and international -- affect issues of justice, democracy and human rights elsewhere. For instance, the Transpacific Trade Partnership (TPP) and the Transatlantic Trade and Investment Partnership (TTIP) are negotiated among national governments, and in the latter case between the European Union and the United States. Through these international trade agreements, the transnational environment and its rules are being shaped and, due to the aggregated size of the economies involved, global standards (official or de facto) are likely to follow them -- pertaining to labor, health, fair trade, property rights and environmental protection.

Finally, we might ask: whose actions do theories of global justice, democracy, and human rights seek to guide today? I tentatively suggest that the international reaction -- of national governments and major international organizations and associations, particularly in the West -- to the Syrian civil war is emerging as a breaking point with respect to this question. For some two decades after the end of the Cold War, theory could plausibly assume that protection and advancement of human rights and democracy was the dominant international ideology, espoused by hegemonic power and other major actors. It made sense, then, for the theory to address, even if very indirectly, these powers and actors and their citizens with proposals, ideas, reflections and demands about democracy, human rights and global justice, and to engage in critical unmasking when massive rifts between ideology and policy appeared. However, in international responses to the crisis in Syria lip service was hardly paid to a hitherto hegemonic international discourse.

The ongoing armed conflict in Syria is estimated by the UN to have inflicted over 220,000 causalities and produced 11 million refugees and IPDs. The numbers evidently do a poor job in depicting the devastation. The war has its origins, some might recall, in unarmed civil protests for democratic reforms, which met the ruthlessly violent government's response. The civil protests were inspired, among other things, by an expectation that "the world", perhaps the "international community", after decades of talk about democracy and human rights, would lend support to these causes. It turned out, however, that international bodies, associations, organizations and governments were unwilling or unable to deliver such support. The decades of talk were not matched by devising a viable course of action. Ardent advocates for human rights and democracy, conflict prevention and international solidarity turned conspicuously quiet.

Here is not the appropriate forum to articulate moral judgements about this development -- though one cannot help but notice that it is deeply sad -- but to point at a question that it gives rise to: if human rights, democracy and global justice are not on the agenda of the powerful, not even as an ideology, whom does political theory in these areas seek to address? Gould perhaps suggests that 'ordinary citizens', when they organize on a small scale, see occasional local achievements. Given the difference that such achievements make for affected individuals, the small scale efforts are no doubt valuable. For future theory, this is an answer worth considering, but it would need to be made clear, then, that no larger-scale progressive politics is on the horizon, that those risking life and limb would know that international support shall not be coming to their aid.