Intermittency: The Concept of Historical Reason in Recent French Philosophy

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Andrew Gibson, Intermittency: The Concept of Historical Reason in Recent French Philosophy, Edinburgh University Press, 2012, 326pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780748637577.

Reviewed by Bruce Baugh, Thompson Rivers University


The name Ronald Reagan does not appear in Andrew Gibson's book. Yet it was Reagan's 1984 "It's Morning in America" campaign which put into political practice the nostalgia for an ideal past that never was but functions as a political myth, a regulative idea for political praxis. Reagan's campaign was built on the promise of the restoration of a golden age, the loss of which many in the United States were then mourning, even though, as Muddy Waters sang, "You can't spend what you ain't got; you can't lose what you never had." Far from unmasking the mythical nature of this thinking, Gibson's book seeks to provide ontological foundations for this "logic" of ideal moments followed by loss and the expectation of a redemptive restoration.

The difference from Reagan is that Gibson's lost paradises serve as regulative ideas for a left-wing political praxis. Following Alain Badiou, Gibson calls these moments "events," which he characterizes as "outbreaks of historical reason" or of "justice and the good," "freedom and equality." Events interrupt the humdrum and oppressive everydayness of ordinary, worldly temporality and introduce something radically new and unpredictable. Prime examples for Gibson are Rome in 503 BCE, when the plebeians are granted a voice in the governance of the Republic, France in 1789-94, Barcelona in 1936, Paris in May 1968 and Berlin 1989, to which he also adds one non-European example, 1164, the date of the "suspension" of Sharia law at a time of messianic expectation in the Ismaili community of Alamut, Persia. Such dates, says Gibson, are not just historical dates among others; "they are dates which define history itself" (44). At the same time, however, such dates are exceedingly "rare." For most of the run of everyday, linear, continuous history, these ecstatic "interruptions" are absent, save for the memory of a promised emancipation, experienced as melancholy for the loss of the event and messianic expectation of its return.

"Intermittency," then, is the interruption of the normal run of things by unpredictable events which are always "new," no matter how often they are repeated, and between these historical moments, the vast "remainder" during which "nothing happens" except for the persistence of injustice and oppression (Walter Benjamin's "catastrophe in permanence", 83-87). Gibson's primary reference point is Badiou. Other French philosophers discussed include Jacques Rancière, who, like Badiou, is becoming well known to English-speaking readers, as well as a trio of relative unknowns: Françoise Proust, Christian Jambet and Guy Lardreau, the latter two of whom followed the familiar trajectory from young "Maoists" (in the French sense) to right-wing nouveaux philosophes, whereas Badiou, Rancière and Proust remained emphatically on the left. Since Gibson is decidedly at sea when discussing other philosophers (Aristotle, Kant, Hegel, Hume), the value of his book consists in his presentation of the ideas of these five philosophers.

One of the major questions concerning Gibson's book is to what extent these philosophers can usefully be grouped together as exponents of a theory of history as "intermittency," a theory which is in fact Gibson's (see 246), and the pursuit of which occasionally requires him to force the texts of not only the philosophers he enlists (see 141-2, 158), but also such diverse literary authors as Orwell, Flaubert, Rimbaud and W. G. Sebald. Gibson does little to situate the philosophers within their contexts or to map their philosophical trajectories. It is not until half-way through the book (157-61) that he mentions that Lardreau and Jambet had been Maoists and it is only in passing that he signals Badiou's allegiance to the anti-humanism of Althusser, Foucault and Lacan (35). Despite sometimes distinguishing between "early" and "late" Badiou or Rancière, he often treats an entire oeuvre en bloc, giving no account of the context in which a given work was written or where it stands in the evolution of the philosopher's thought. Gibson most often dives straight into exegesis of arguments which are sometimes difficult to follow, offering the reader no orientation points or footholds for crossing difficult terrain.

The "Introduction" serves to introduce the key ideas of Gibson's study. A potted summary of Kojève's Hegel interpretation serves only as a foil for an alternative theory of history based on Badiou and Jambet. In contrast to the view according to which history is the continuous and progressive development of Spirit or Reason towards an ultimate goal ("absolute knowing," "the end of history"), Jambet posits a "time of the creative effusion" manifested in "evenemential upsurges," in which an indefinite prophetic future invades the present "always as if for the first time." The series of events constitutes not a linear progression following some dialectical necessity or overarching logic (33-4) but rather a "series of unpredictable and discrete singularities" (8) arising contingently from "the historical Abgrund of historical indetermination" (9). The contingency of events connects them with an open future, rather than a teleologically determined one, and so links freedom with the initiation of new processes that do not follow from old processes and the laws which govern them (34). This means that events cannot be explained even in hindsight (207), but like Epicurus' clinamen are unpredictable departures from the regular order which result in a disordering and reordering of the world (33, 213).

History then is neither teleological nor meaningless chaos, but has the structure of intermittency (14, 43). Intermittency results not just from contingency, but also from the gap between the inexhaustible creative power, "an infinite power of innovation" (116) analogous to natura naturans, and the historical instances it founds (9, 125-7). This gap between creative freedom and events preserves freedom as contingency and prevents creative freedom from being continuously present or fully incarnated in history (122), thus accounting for both the "remainder" between events and for "the essential heterogeneity of historical time" (43).

Melancholy is the obverse of the ecstasy of the event, the awareness of the loss following a moment of illumination (47), just as withdrawal and obscurity are the obverse of the creative freedom's epiphany. History is "melancholic-ecstatic" (10), manifestation alternating with occultation (132), messianic expectation giving way to despair (131-2). Gibson criticizes Badiou for an "affirmationism" which wants to think the event but avoids thinking the prevalence of the "remainder": the melancholic time of disappointed hopes and loss of truth (47-53, 283). Gibson argues that "the failure, death or absence" of events "is necessarily commonplace, leaving a melancholy of the interim" (224) that threatens the subject with a loss of self, the loss of the belief that there was ever anything to lose (135). The melancholic subject is "the most common subject of history, whether it knows it or not" (267). For his part, Badiou has stated his aversion to melancholy and "sniveling" (pleurnicherie) (47, 52).

Gibson sees Sartre as the first theorist of intermittency and as an influence on Lardreau, Jambet and Proust (15); he goes so far as to say that Sartre's Critique of Dialectical Reason (1960) "arguably remains in advance of most if not all of those whom his thought has most influenced" (21). Instead of simply assuming the rarity of "events," Sartre tries to account for it through his analysis of material scarcity (rareté). Scarcity, as a lack within the organism, binds humans to a material world which responds to our needs only as transformed by work, setting up a tension between spontaneous, creative transformation (freedom) and the inertia and recalcitrance of matter (260). The "return" of worked matter's inertia is manifested when the spontaneity of the revolutionary group-in-fusion, which transcends individuals toward a common project of liberation (as when the "mob" storms the Bastille in 1789), is degraded into "practico-inert institutions" through which the revolution attempts to persist but which smother the spontaneity which launched it (17-19).

Gibson illustrates this process of "hysteresis" (9-20), a term which is not Sartre's (19-20), using Orwell's Homage to Catalonia. Orwell describes the "deep change" that took place in Barcelona between when he first arrived in 1936, when there was a palpable atmosphere of freedom and revolutionary solidarity, and his return in 1937, when he noted the virtual disappearance of revolutionary dress and forms of speech and the reappearance of signs of inequality (expensive clothing and cars, a hierarchical military with a privileged officer caste) as the Communists turned a revolution into "an ordinary war" (20). For Gibson, then, Sartre is a theorist of intermittency par excellence, recognizing both the rarity of revolutionary moments and explaining "the declension of the event" through (in Sartre's words) "the parasitic development of the practico-inert within the field of praxis" (20).

Lacan also gets a sympathetic treatment, albeit one which will prove impenetrable to anyone not already familiar with his thought. Lacan is discussed in relation to Lardreau, who emphasizes Lacan's theme of an irremediable lack which is both the origin of selfhood and renders complete or whole selfhood impossible (much as the Abgrund of history prevents its total completion or end). Working a familiar trope, Gibson recounts how for Lacan the object of desire is produced as the "imaginary result" of the subject's failure to state the Real in language, making the object a semblant that "disappoints as it pleases" but which one pretends (on fait semblant) satisfies (161-5). Yet there is always a fault-line (faille) in the mechanism of deception, one which coincides with the unsayable Real, which is "that against which the political illusion shatters" (Lardreau, cited 162). The Real, in its very unsayability, is that which resists "historically determinate forms of representation and knowledge" and so founds the possibility for subjects breaking free of illusion (169, 180). Despite his contention that the lack that is the basis of semblance and mutual misrecognition is intrinsic to human beings -- rendering aggressivity and conflict irremediable -- Lacan, like Sartre, leaves room for the event through the faille. The faille makes possible a break with the past and the inauguration of new beginnings, in particular, though a "declaration" initiating a new form of speech (262), especially in modern literature, which invokes "a modern subject who attends, stalls, delays, finds complex and subtle practices appropriate to a hiatus he or she cannot be certain will not be interminable" (280).

The notion of a "fault-line in being" is central to Gibson's account of Badiou. Gibson refers to this fault-line as "the void," which he in turn relates to the empty (vide) set in mathematical set theory (27-9). As with Badiou, one wonders to what extent the mathematics underwrite the main political and ontological point, namely, that every structure also contains a fault or an aleatory point that allows an event to unravel that structure so that "unthinkable possibilities" appear. This absolutely chance point cannot be foreseen on the basis of what exists. It is an exception to the rule and inaugurates a "truth" which cannot be demonstrated or even thought based on the previously existing world (29-34, 36-37, 50). A subject is defined, in rather Kierkegaardian fashion, as someone who must first suspend the ontological and ethical rules in a decision or a wager on an objectively unprovable truth and then maintain "fidelity" (loyalty, faith) towards that truth (29-30, 40-41, 47, 271-3). However, Badiou's subject is not self-interested, but instead is "caught up" in an event that transcends individual interests, much like Sartre's revolutionary subject storming the Bastille or, in Badiou's rather Romantic view, two people in love (30-32). "Faithful" subjects remain enthusiasts for the new truth, despite its vicissitudes in the world, whereas "reactive" subjects act as if nothing really happened and seek a return to the status quo ante (40-41).

The themes of faithful waiting, epiphany and loss, ecstasy and melancholy, are played out in Gibson's discussions of Jambet, Lardreau and Rancière. Jambet focuses on an esoteric form of Islam from which he extracts a theory of the event as the epiphany of a long-hidden truth (114) and an ontology of a creative principle (an "infinite power of innovation") which is never fully present in the created world (115-16). The creative principle, analogous to Plotinus' One, "ceaselessly brings the world into being but does not intervene in it," and is revealed only in illumination although, having no essence, it cannot be an object of knowledge (116, 122). Moments of illumination institute another temporality distinct from mundane time. History is then a succession of discrete temporalities founded on encounters with "the unfounded freedom of the real," an absolutely hidden Other (119) never exhausted by the created forms which manifest it (122-24, 127). The subject arising from this encounter obeys an "imperative of freedom," freedom being the infinite becoming-other of the creative principle. Yet the very possibility of illumination grounds the inevitable occultation of truth and a retreat of the faithful "subject in waiting" into inwardness, "an invisible secret and an inner territory" (131-36), that of the creative imagination not subject to the intellect, an "imaginal" world of prophecies and visions in which justice and the good take refuge when they have flown from the world (137-40). Gibson's illustration of this using Rimbaud's poetry (141-53) may strike some readers as rather forced and reductive.

Beyond Lardreau's use of Lacan with reference to the subject's possible resistance to historically determinate forms of "semblance" (169), Lardreau's idea that Kant's moral subject's obedience to the moral law is the "interruption" of freedom in a world of phenomenal necessity (174) evades too many questions, and the discussion of Kant's theories of history is particularly unpersuasive (178-9). Most of Gibson's discussion of Rancière echoes what Gibson had already said about Sartre and Badiou: revolutionary irruptions of equality are extraordinary and rare exceptions followed by a decline into passivity and inertia, a "waiting time" or "dead time" (202-8, 223-6). Despite Rancière's denunciations of "post-modern disenchantment" and melancholy, Gibson sees him as "caught up in a peculiarly intense version of the melancholic-ecstatic conception of history" because he sees events as scattered and sporadic "sparks" against a dark background of everydayness (223, 225).

What is interesting is the discussion of Rancière on democracy as "the clash of free and equal intelligences" rather than its contemporary simulacrum, the free exchange of opinion within the framework of a general consensus (208-9). Rancière, referring to Plato's idea in the Laws that some higher offices should be selected by lot, states that "true democracy makes all those privileged by birth, wealth, age or learning bow down before the law of chance which granted them their advantages in the first place" (210). Yet Rancière distinguishes the demos of equals who freely dissent from one another with the mob united for a single purpose (219), a distinction which Gibson does not seem to realize runs contrary to his valorization of Sartre's group-in-fusion and which, moreover, replicates the Enlightenment distinction between le peuple and la canaille, even though Rancière inveighs against the elitism of Marx's distinction between the "proletarian," a revolutionary in waiting, and mere workers and lumpens (202). In the same vein, Gibson and Rancière's discussion of the emancipatory power of art, its power to suspend the world and allow us to experience it differently (231-33), relies on examples from high art (Flaubert, Edgar Varèse, Joyce, Wagner) which are unlikely to do much for those of North or West African descent living in the quartiers de banlieue of France's major cities. Elitism persists even in its critics.

The discussion of art and the imagination occupies a major part of Gibson's study, and it is here that Françoise Proust's philosophy comes into its own. Proust offers a new transcendental aesthetic which takes as its starting point Kant's "Analytic of the Sublime" in the Critique of Judgment. The experience of the sublime requires a receptivity to an indeterminate force, a "counter-nature" which overturns nature as a system of deterministic laws governing phenomena, a power which exceeds the faculties and founds them, including even space and time as a priori forms of intuition (72). All faculties, even reason, involve an openness to being affected by a motive power (Bewegungskraft); empirical sensibility is merely an aspect of une pathétique transcendentale, a transcendental receptivity. Since this receptivity is not subordinate to reason and the understanding, it is linked to aesthetic freedom as experimentation and spontaneous receptivity to the new, a sensibility which is distinctively modern (74). The groundlessness of transcendental receptivity originates a more primordial, "wild" time that allows unpredictable events to interrupt linear time, constituting "modern time" as the repetition of new beginnings (76, 78-81). Just as artistic genius produces new and unprecedented forms, "so too there is a historical genius," a wild and formless power of origination ("sublime freedom") which tears history apart at irregular intervals (74-6).

The subject of modernity, then, is constituted by a new sensibility and an affective encounter with the event, rather than by any subjective action; action risks "moral error" and compromising "pure receptivity" (77). Yet like the artistic genius, the modern subject, under the impetus of being affected by the event, must "actively and spontaneously decree its own laws" and "declare" itself as an exemplar for others to follow, not with respect to the content of what it produces, but as a model of self-invention (78). It is no wonder that Gibson uses Wordsworth's The Prelude to illustrate these ideas (97-108). One would think that Hegel had never criticized the "beautiful soul" which refuses to sully the purity of its sensibility in action and which ceaselessly proclaims the genius of its moral "convictions."

This raises a major problem with Gibson's whole "ecstatic-melancholic" conception of history, alluded to at the outset of this review. Gibson's emphasis on events as a break with the way of the world often gives the impression that the best the "faithful subject" can do in these desolate times is to watch and wait for a revolutionary event which will overturn the world and our sensibility (see 273). Gibson is aware that his view seems to "disempower the subject" (77) and comes close to a conservative view of history (268), but he does not understand why.

Although "in principle . . . it is possible to overcome the inertia of history" (255-6), an event idealized as a complete break from history and as inaugurating a new time has never existed. The French Republic's new calendar, with its Year One of the Revolution and new months, never took hold in the popular imagination. The "events" of May 1968 came to an end when De Gaulle triumphantly returned to Paris to the cheers of millions. There is something of "an infantile French leftism" in the theory of intermittency (269). If one insists on an absolute and absolutely unpredictable event as the sine qua non of human emancipation, and so dismisses any forms of "gradualism" or "progressivism," then this insistence on "all or nothing" will leave one with nothing, every time. You can't spend what you ain't got; you can't lose what you never had.