Internalism and Externalism in Semantics and Epistemology

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Sanford C. Goldberg (ed.), Internalism and Externalism in Semantics and Epistemology, Oxford University Press, 2007, 303pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199275755.

Reviewed by Hanseung Kim, University of Seoul


This book contains twelve papers that do not appear elsewhere in print (though most of them were presented by the authors at a conference under the same title held in 2005 at the University of Kentucky). We are not told specifically which papers were presented at the conference, but rest assured that all the papers in the book focus on its unique topic. The topic's uniqueness lies in the "and" in regards to "semantics and epistemology" (emphasis mine). The book would be much less interesting if it were made up of twelve papers solely on semantics or solely on epistemology.

In both semantics and epistemology, the "internalism vs. externalism" debate has been one of the most prolific topics. The terms "internalism" and "externalism" are associated with a variety of meanings in both semantics and epistemology and their use is not limited to these two areas (there is, for instance, an internalism/externalism debate in ethics). It is probable that the terms were widely used in epistemology before their use became common in semantics. In epistemology, the term "externalism" was used by Armstrong, Goldman, Dretske, and others to describe a different view from that of the traditional Cartesian view on the issue of justification of non-inferential beliefs. According to epistemic externalism, when one knows that P, there should be some sort of external or natural relation that holds between the subject's 'inner' belief and the 'outer' world. On the other hand, epistemic internalism is the view that justification of a belief is a function of elements that are internally accessible to the subject. What distinguishes 'internal' from 'external' in epistemology is the subject's accessibility to the means of justification of his or her belief.

In semantics, 'externalism' has two interrelated versions: One is meaning externalism, and the other is content externalism. Meaning externalism refers roughly to the view that meaning is determined by what is 'external' to a language user. It goes against the traditional ideational view that meaning should be founded on a subject's ideas. It also goes against the more recent inferential-role view that meaning plays a role in a subject's inferential reasoning. Content externalism, on the other hand, is the view that the contents of a subject's mental states are at least partially determined by facts in the external environment in which the subject is situated. Putnam's historic Twin Earth thought experiment is supposed to present a strong case for both versions of semantic externalism. The semantic content of the term "water" used by a Twin Earthian is not identical to that of "water" used by us even if the term is associated with the same ideas or inferential roles in both Twin Earthians and Earthians. What distinguishes "internal" from "external" in semantics is thus the subject's accessibility to meaning-fixing elements.

From these rough formulations it seems that there exists a strong connection between internalism/externalism debates in both the areas of semantics and epistemology. The common issue between the two is what kind of role the subject is capable of playing. Internalists say, "a substantial role," while externalists say, "not a serious role." These answers may seem too rash, yet we can expect that the following reasoning will naturally lead to them. Suppose that what the term 'X' means is determined "externally". When a subject believes 'X is φ', then at least some part of her belief content depends upon external facts (of which she might be ignorant). In this way, it would depend upon external facts, at least partially, whether her belief can be justified or not. Thus, semantic externalism supports epistemic externalism. According to these 'pure' internalists or externalists, any combinations of internalism and externalism would be incompatible.

In "Externalism in Mind and Epistemology," Jessica Brown addresses the question whether semantic externalism is compatible with epistemic internalism. She claims that only one version of epistemic internalism is compatible with semantic externalism: Supervenience on the Mental (SM). SM claims the following: "Whether a thinker is justified in believing p supervenes on that thinker's occurent and dispositional mental states." SM is a version of epistemic internalism that does not require that a thinker have a special access to the facts which determine justification. According to Brown, however, all the attempts to defend SM fail. In other words, a viable epistemic internalism is incompatible with semantic externalism.

Earl Conee argues in "Externally Enhanced Internalism" that SM, or what he calls "Mentalism," is not only a viable version of epistemic internalism but it also helps out internalism with the difficulties raised by content externalists towards epistemic internalism. As one example of such difficulties, he takes a case in which Smith partially understands the word "vegan." Conee argues that Mentalism is the only version of epistemic internalism that can explain such partially understood cases.

Upon somewhat different grounds, Brad Majors and Sarah Sawyer propose an account that accommodates both internalistic and externalistic intuitions in "Entitlement, Opacity, and Connection." They present two problems that an adequate theory of knowledge should take seriously: the Connection Problem and the Problem of Opacity. The former is the problem of how the world and the subject relate. While epistemic internalism is troubled by this problem, semantic externalism finds no difficulty in handling it. The Problem of Opacity, on the other hand, concerns the means by which the subject relates to himself. It is the problem of how one should explain his privileged access to his own thoughts. Semantic externalism, not epistemic internalism, faces this problem. Majors and Sawyer argue that the internalism/externalism debate is to be viewed as part of a much larger battle between empiricism and rationalism. They argue that the key to resolving the debate lies in what Burge calls "intellectual norms."

What "internal" means is critical to various versions of internalism. In "What and About What is Internalism?" Richard Fumerton claims that if "internal states" are understood as referring to mental states (as psychological externalists and Conee suggest), then epistemic "internalism" is not so much internalism as it is a version of externalism in disguise. He argues that epistemic internalism should focus on epistemic properties such as the property of having justification to believe rather than the property of having a justified belief. He believes that internal states are not necessarily representational ones. Epistemic externalism might accommodate this by conflating internal states with representational states. Fumerton, however, claims that there are still merits in epistemic internalism which do not endorse representationalism.

If semantic externalism and epistemic internalism are truly incompatible, one might adopt externalism by casting doubts upon important presuppositions of epistemic internalism. It is commonly admitted that at least some portions of our beliefs are justified solely in terms of the meanings of the terms which constitute the objects of those beliefs. A priori knowledge is understood as a paradigmatic example of such beliefs. John Hawthorne, however, argues in "A Priority and Externalism" that the a priori/a posteriori distinction has no substantial epistemological role. Apriority of epistemic justification occurs when there is no influence of environment on one's knowledge and yet, he argues, all human knowledge requires that the environment play a "safe haven" role.

When Putnam presented his idea on semantic externalism, he used it to argue against skepticism. If the meaning of the expression "a brain-in-a-vat" is determined externally, then a subject's belief that "I am not a brain-in-a-vat" is true, regardless of whether she is a brain-in-a-vat or not. Duncan Prichard in "How to Be a Neo-Moorean" addresses this anti-skeptical response. What he has in mind is the Moorean "common sense" anti-skepticism. Even though the Moorean view seems intuitively convincing, he argues, it faces many reasonable complaints. One way of saving the Moorean view is to deny the Closure Principle, which states that a subject knows what her belief implies if she knows this implication. However, Prichard believes that denying Closure costs too much. He offers a Neo-Moorean account that retains Closure and provides a better anti-skeptic response than other rival views, specifically, contextualism. Contextualism, defended by Keith DeRose, David Lewis, and others, is the view that the expression 'know' has an indexical element in that the standards of knowledge vary depending upon the context in which the expression is used. Prichard argues that contextualism is right in denying that we cannot know that we are not brains-in-a-vat but undermines our intuition that the expression 'know' is not context-sensitive.

Putnam's Twin-Earth example raises the issue of whether semantic externalism is compatible with self-knowledge. Consider a purely indexical belief such as "I am here now." It seems that what an Earthian and his or her Twin-Earthian entertain in believing this statement have something in common in an important sense. And it seems that one does not have to be aware of environmental factors to entertain that very belief. Explaining this character of indexical belief poses a task for semantic externalists. In "Inference that Leaves Something to Chance," David Sosa claims that self-knowledge per se is not incompatible with semantic externalism. He argues, however, that semantic externalism rejects the substantial epistemic role of self-knowledge. He examines and extends Paul Boghossian's argument against externalism. According to Sosa, externalism allows for the possibility that a subject makes an invalid inference and yet is not in a position to find out whether or not her inference is invalid. (A reader can find, however, a disagreement with Boghossian's argument in Sanford Goldberg's contribution, "Semantic Externalism and Epistemic Illusions.")

As said before, the merit of this book lies in the "and" in its title, "semantics and epistemology." I have no space to review all the papers in the volume and yet want to emphasize that all the papers maintain a high level of clarity and intensity. The authors have indeed done their job by narrowing down the issues to the shared theme. A reader with more general interests in both fields, however, might find that the scope of the issues covered is a bit too narrow. Most of the papers address, directly or indirectly, two basic questions in the following order: Is semantic externalism correct? And, what does semantic externalism imply with respect to epistemic internalism? Granted that semantic concerns are important in dealing with epistemic questions, the latter are not wholly contingent upon positions we take in semantics. We could ask questions in a different order: for example, first ask whether epistemic internalism (or externalism) is correct and then examine its implications for semantic externalism (or internalism). Readers might also like to know how the issues addressed in this book are related to the recently discussed topic of two-dimensionalism. Most of the authors implicitly regard typical epistemic internalism or traditional empiricism as an abandoned view, and yet have lingering doubts about that claim. In this regard, the book would look a little more balanced if it included papers written by authors with a greater variety of philosophical interests.