International Law as Social Construct: The Struggle for Global Justice

Placeholder book cover

Carlo Focarelli, International Law as Social Construct: The Struggle for Global Justice, Oxford University Press, 2012, lii + 571pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199584833.

Reviewed by George W. Rainbolt, Georgia State University


This book is divided into two parts. Part I, "Law as Social Construct," is composed of Chapters 1-3 and offers a general theory of "what law is" (9). Chapter 1 claims that law is a social construct in the sense that "it is a product of human social interactions rather than existing independently of human beings" (35). The chapter holds that "law is not like a mountain, ie [sic] an empirically observable fact open to scientific verification or falsification" (495, emphasis in original). Developing some of Freud's remarks, Chapter 1 also holds that "law amounts to collective violence aimed at countering individual violence" (4).

Chapter 2 affirms that law is "what is believed by a group as a whole to be their law" (34) and that "the social construction of law is ultimately founded in myth" (43). It holds that "myth is a narrative which refers to a per se non-mythic reality by unveiling it as mythic from the viewpoint of another lived reality that is potentially capable of being further unveiled as mythic" (47).

Chapter 3 holds that "law embodies common meanings that ensure people live in a communal world, ie [sic] in a 'rational' world rooted in common sense and social attunement where certain claims count as arguments while others do not, and certain arguments are better than others" (66). It also asserts that "what matters in law is not what is logically irresistible, but what 'works in practice' in any particular society" (66).

Part II, "The Construction of International Law," is composed of Chapters 4-8 and "applies the constructionist approach delineated in Part I to international law" (4). Chapter 4 asserts that

(a) international law is invariably thought of according to Western analytical categories and words, whatever its contents, beginning with the very word 'law'; (b) doctrine constantly mythologizes, demythologizes, and remythologizes international law in various, often opposing, directions, here again through Western standards of theoretical analysis and within a relatively closed circle of professionals; and (c) the construction of international law by the media, today crucial, is far from being effective. (139-140)

This chapter explores nine "theoretical models of international law": "naturalism, positivism, realism, axiologism, deconstructionism, sociologism, constitutionalism, administrativism, and third-worldism" (4).

Chapter 5 considers the following question: "If international law is socially constructed, who is 'directly' engaged in its construction?" (141, emphasis in original) The chapter surveys the role of "states," "international organizations," "individuals," "trans-state players," "counter-state players," and "sui generis players" (x). It claims that

the globalized states system is central, although it is the historical product of injustice and increasingly unable satisfactorily to manage global concerns. The injustice of the system as a global project is, however, irreversible and, at least in the short and medium term, justice should be basically pursued within the system, giving due consideration to the inherited injustice of the system itself (240, emphasis in original).

Chapter 6 "investigates how the rules and other normative standards of international law are made, integrated, reconciled, changed, judicially applied, complied with, implemented within states, and enforced" (241). The chapter surveys the "sources of law," "law-making," "judicial and quasi-judicial decision-making," and "compliance, implementation, and enforcement" (xi). It asserts that

all international law rules and judicial decisions are ultimately grounded in custom as a basic form of social informal pressure by the states system and that no 'private affair' is conceivable in the system even when rules apply only to particular states, although rules are not necessarily always applicable to all states. (241)

Chapter 7 asks "what 'values' are believed to be protected, or to be worth being better protected, by the rules of international law" (356). It focuses on "five (by no means exhaustive) basic global values: security, humanity, wealth, environment, and knowledge" (356). Its thesis is that "there is much to struggle for, both in improving global justice and in overcoming inconsistencies" (356). While the book asserts that "a general definition of justice is not only either impossible or empty, but also undesirable and dangerous" (57), it goes on to claim that

injustice is to treat people (or other living beings) in such a way that they experience absolute, or manifest out-of-proportion impotence vis-à-vis an overwhelming power, or manifestly exercised omnipotence, of other human beings, which generally amounts to deprivation of human basic needs. (59)

It also asserts that "justice is here understood as the protection of the most vulnerable" (3).

Chapter 8 affirms that "it is difficult to draw definite legal conclusions from [the concept of obligations erga omnes] and that humanitarian intervention is not permitted within the responsibility to protect doctrine (RtoP) unless mandated on a case-by-case basis by the UN Security Council" (462). In addition, "the case [is] made for the operation of international courts as the best tool available, despite their shortcomings, to combat the abuse of power by rulers and bring more justice in and to the system" (489).

This review appears in Notre Dame Philosophical Reviews and so evaluates the book as a contribution to the philosophical discussion of global justice. It may not have been written to contribute this discussion. It may have been intended as a contribution to discussions occurring in law, political science, or international relations.

With 497 pages of text, 53 pages of front matter, and 73 pages of back matter, this book is long. These page counts underestimate the volume's length. Both the typeface and the margins are significantly smaller than usual.

This book does not interact with contemporary debates in philosophy. Here are some examples. On the question of what law is, there is no discussion of Hart, Dworkin, Coleman, or Raz. (In some cases, there are quick gestures to their work.) On the nature of global justice, the only reference to Rawls' The Law of Peoples is in one footnote and the only references to Pogge are in four footnotes. The author repeatedly rejects the views that law is like a mountain and that legal analysis can and should proceed by using the scientific method. However, I do not know of a philosopher who defends these views. Focarelli takes controversial positions in metaethics, philosophy of science, and the philosophy of logic with no discussion of the contemporary literature. For example, he asserts that "deductive reasoning proceeds syllogistically by drawing a conclusion from a major and a minor premise" (67), and does not seem to be aware that this theory of the nature of deduction is at variance with much of the literature.

There are many puzzling assertions; for example, that "only rarely are front pages and columnists critical of the official position of national governments" (133). While this may be true in some countries, one need only reflect on examples such as Fox News' coverage of U.S. actions in Libya to see that, in many countries, criticism of the government is a daily affair.

This book does not offer arguments. Each chapter begins with the assertion of a view or views. The chapter is then a large set of comments about various matters related to the view(s). Finally, the view(s) is again asserted.

For the three reasons just outlined, I cannot recommend this book.